Mind, Language and Morality: Essays in Honour of Mark Platts

Placeholder book cover

Gustavo Ortiz-Millán and Juan Antonio Cruz Parcero (eds.), Mind, Language and Morality: Essays in Honour of Mark Platts, Routledge, 2018, 196pp, $140.00, ISBN 9780815385028.

Reviewed by Samuel Guttenplan, Birkbeck College, London


This festschrift contains nine essays originally given as talks in 2012 at a conference in honour of Mark Platts, a philosopher who originally taught in Magdalen College, Oxford and Birkbeck College, London, and then emigrated to the National Autonomous University in Mexico City (UNAM) nearly forty years ago. His published work began with Ways of Meaning (1979), an expository treatment of the truth conditional semantic programme initially developed by Donald Davidson. Platts' Ways has been influential, and a second edition was published in 1997. One chapter of Ways set out to extend truth conditional semantics to moral language -- an extension that was then no part of Davidson's programme -- and Platts published Moral Realities (1991), extending this work and considering its ramifications for moral psychology. He has also devoted time and thought to more applied aspects of law and morality, especially including his work regarding those diagnosed with HIV/AIDS. Added to this, his teaching has clearly influenced more than one generation of philosophers in Mexico, which makes it is easy to see why colleagues at the UNAM wanted to honour him with the conference and the publication of papers of certain of its participants.

From the point of view of a general reader, festschrifts can be problematic. Collections of papers by friends and colleagues, lacking any unifying theme other than the desire to honour their subjects, can make reading an uneven struggle. This volume does suffer from this lack of unity, but the quality of many of the papers make it worth persevering. Also, though its title reflects the different areas of philosophy to which Platts has contributed, a number of the papers touch only lightly on Platts' own work, something perfectly reasonable in a festschrift. Bearing all this in mind -- and given the space I have, as well as the limits of my own philosophical resources -- I cannot discuss every paper. So, I will be selective. But first, here is a brief outline of what the volume contains.

The papers by Barry Stroud, Ralph Walker and Gutavo Ortiz-Millán take up various themes in moral philosophy that Platts' own work has touched on or developed. James Griffin contributes a piece on the outlook for treating some form of equality as a foundational principle in morality. Paul Snowdon offers some reflections on the rule-following passages in Wittgenstein's Investigations. Larry Laudan explores the often-cited, but not always understood, legal principle that defendants should be considered innocent until, as the formula has it, they are shown by trial to be guilty. Rodolfo Vazquez and Juan Antonio Cruz Parcero write about human rights. And the final chapter by Jim Hopkins takes off from Platts' Davidsonian account of meaning and radical interpretation, going on to develop a complex story about how this can be treated within a neuroscientific -- and Bayesian - framework.

Stroud's paper, 'Ways of Meaning and Knowing Moral Realities', begins with a succinct summary of Davidson's truth conditional account of what a speaker must know to understand a language, and he notes Platts' insistence that this account does not need to be supplemented or superseded by one which tells us about the grounds or recognitional procedures that a speaker might use in such understanding. Platts calls this a 'realist' account of a speaker's understanding; others have described it as 'austere'. In Ways, and then in his later book, Moral Realities, Platts further insists that we can properly extend this truth conditional account to evaluative language, and that when we do so, we bring a defensible moral realism in train. In sum, we end up with the view that there are moral properties to which we are sensitive, but which exist independently of human judgements or evaluation. Stroud is sympathetic to this general line of thought, but he is unsure of the metaphysical robustness of this talk of realism, and, as developed in the paper, this issue is crucial to his criticism of Platts.

The details are rich and worth working through, but in outline his criticism is straightforward. Platts believes he has to defend himself from the charge of 'transcendentalism' -- the charge that it is 'hard to swallow' the idea that the value properties which figure in our truth-conditionally apt moral evaluations are 'completely independent of human valuings and desirings'. Stroud, I think rightly, suggests that 'transcendence' would be a better term for this challenge, and he thinks that Platts has no such obligation. This is because Platts' own resistance to anti-realism/verificationism in respect of truth conditional accounts of meaning should by itself be enough to see off any such challenge. Of course, this suggests that the realism at issue is not as rich metaphysically as some may have thought (or hoped). But, though he doesn't return directly to this issue at the end of the paper, my sense is that Stroud would count this lack of robustness as something in its favour, and, for what it's worth, I would agree with him.

Ralph Walker's 'Platts on Kant and Mandeville' begins with positive remarks about Platts' moral realism, though Walker, sympathetic to this position, doesn't commit himself to it. In any case, the main aim of the paper is the rather more scholarly one of addressing Platts' treatments of Kant and Mandeville, as well as judging the relevance of these philosophers' views to Platts' project. Walker argues that Kant's view, when properly understood, is much closer to Platts' moral realism than Platts himself allows, and he thinks that Mandeville is much less of a threat to that view than Platts seems to think. Walker rejects the rule-worshipping caricature of Kant's moral theory -- which to some extent Platts seems to accept -- and when we move away from that caricature, the differences between Kant and Platts come down mostly to matters of terminology and emphasis. Where a difference does remain, it concerns the possibility of a unitary moral principle which in various ways guides all our moral choices. As Walker sees it, Platts' potentially pluralistic intuitionism finds no obvious place for such a principle, whereas, quite clearly, Kant's categorical imperative is intended to be at least the beginning of one. On this point, Walker sides with Kant, though he also thinks that arguments alone will not settle the issue in the absence of any satisfactory 'all-embracing formula'.

As to Mandeville, Walker thinks that Platts has taken this notorious moral sceptic too seriously. As Platts sees it, Mandeville's insistence on the self-serving and self-aggrandizing basis of our moral views would, if correct, threaten the idea that we could act on the putatively objective moral intuitions he thinks we have. Walker sees in Kant (and Aristotle) a picture of moral motivation which allows us simply to dismiss Mandeville's account as perhaps psychologically interesting, but ultimately not relevant. This is because, he thinks both Kant and Aristotle -- and Platts -- understand moral action as based both on our first-order propensities and motivations and, crucially, on a second-order capacity to decide morally among, or even reject, these propensities in specific cases. Mandeville's bleak -- and I have always thought slightly tongue-in-cheek -- picture of human nature thus doesn't really engage with properly understood accounts of morality.

Ortiz-Millán's 'Wrong Direction?' takes issue with those, including Platts, who appeal to the somewhat metaphorical idea that beliefs and desires display different 'directions of fit', that a belief is a mental state whose success conditions require it to fit with how the world is, whereas desire's success conditions require the world to come to fit it. The agenda of the paper is ambitious: it is claimed that talk of direction of fit commits us to the specific theories of truth, and that it also commits us to a view of human motivation. Both of these commitments are challenged, and we are then offered a 'normative' account of beliefs, desires and other mental states, an account which doesn't have such dodgy commitments.

The idea that casual and perhaps metaphorical talk of direction of fit commits one to some one of the theories of truth (correspondence, coherence, deflationary, minimalist) seemed to me a bit of a stretch. No less of a stretch was the claim that such talk commits us to a Humean account of motivation. But perhaps all the author really means -- and he comes close to saying this at one point on p. 35 -- is that talk of directions of fit might make one predisposed to certain views of truth and motivation, even though they are not argumentative commitments. Ortiz-Millán's own proposal suggests replacing direction-of-fit talk with the idea that belief and desire entail normative commitments: belief answers to truth and desire to the good. This is of course a familiar idea, but I was unclear how far this really takes us from talk of 'direction of fit', when the latter is understood in an appropriately relaxed way.

James Griffin's 'Equality as a Foundation of Ethics' is an exploratory paper: it sets out to see how far we can get by taking various principles of equality as foundational to morals. After a historical introduction, he sets out on this exploration by noting that 'somewhere in our journey from the late Middle Ages to today . . . we could reasonably claim to have entered the Age of Equality' (p. 50). But on this same page, he insists that our understanding of equality 'suffers badly from incompleteness', and so he has set himself two tasks: saying more about what equality comes to, and then seeing whether it could serve as the basis of ethics. It is doing no disservice to Griffin to say that neither of these tasks is completed: the paper was never meant to be more than exploratory. And I found much in the details of this exploration to admire, even including his rather pessimistic conclusion: 'For all we know, the foundational principle of equality is empty and there is no such principle at the base of ethics.'

Larry Laudan's 'Convergence or Divergence in the Evolutional of (Criminal) Rights? A Case Study of the Multiple Incoherencies of the Presumption of Innocence', does just what its title promises. He first sets out the ways in which the right to the presumption of innocence (PI) fails to have, in different jurisdictions, anything like a coherent set of evidential and procedural consequences. This then leads Laudan to consider whether the PI itself is coherent: whether, in fact, there is any formulation of the PI which is clear and self-consistent. While the first part was revealing, it wasn't all that surprising. Even if there were a single coherent core to the PI, one would expect that its implementation would vary in different legal systems. (Which is not to say that this variation is a good thing or is defensible.) But is there a single coherent core to the PI? Laudan thinks not. He first canvasses certain unacceptable formulations, such as 'a person is innocent until proven guilty'. (This is found to be hopeless because if 'innocent' means factually what it says, the person should be understood as innocent whatever the verdict at the trial.) But I found myself wondering whether this wasn't making rather heavy weather of the issue. Further, and potentially better formulations follow, and while these are rejected, I found myself wanting to say that surely there is something at work here -- perhaps something only relevant in respect of instructions to a jury -- which is neither incoherent or absurd.

Paul Snowdon, in 'Wittgenstein on Rule Following', makes clear that he does not intend to address Platts' published work and that the only connection with that work is that both Wittgenstein and Platts are concerned with the concepts of meaning and understanding. Moreover, except for a few remarks at the beginning of the paper, Snowdon doesn't engage with what is now a vast literature on rule-following in Wittgenstein. Instead, he focuses almost exclusively on the relevant passages in Philosophical Investigations from §138 to §242, offering us his reactions to that text and reaching no overarching conclusions. I have some sympathy with this way of proceeding: encrusted as it is with multiple interpretations, it is easy to lose sight of the text itself. So, a careful and relatively untheoretic approach is refreshing, especially when offered by someone as thoughtful as Snowdon. That said, things don't get off to a good start. Snowdon worries about what Wittgenstein could mean by 'fitting' in §138, but fails to take into consideration what is said in §§136-7, which seem to me to make the opening move clearer than Snowdon allows. (A footnote acknowledges someone's having pointed out to Snowdon that he should perhaps have begun with §136, but there is no mention of how important these earlier passages might be.)

I mention what seems to me an oversight not because it seriously undermines Snowdon's initial discussion, but because it put me on my guard when trying to understand some of the ruminations about later passages. Crucial to Snowdon's final remarks is a detailed consideration of the sections in Wittgenstein discussing 'reading', i.e. the capacity we have to move from text or marks to sound. Wittgenstein clearly thinks his remarks here illuminate his discussion of understanding, even though reading as described is not intended as reading with understanding. Snowdon focuses on §157, the passage in which Wittgenstein considers a 'reading'-machine (e.g. pianola, or, to bring it up to date, a computer's text-to-speech facility). Snowdon seems to think that Wittgenstein regards such machines as doing what a human being does in reading, and this leads him to question Wittgenstein's own conclusions about reading and understanding. I am not so sure that this is how we should take §157, but there is no space here to back up my own view. Still, always interesting, Snowdon's paper should be taken into account, not merely by Wittgenstein scholars, but those concerned with the problems of meaning and understanding.

Jim Hopkins, 'Kantian Neuroscience and Radical Interpretation', is perhaps the most ambitious of the papers. Its starting point is the Davidsonian truth-conditional account of meaning -- the subject of Platts' first book -- but its aim is that of evaluating the whole of that programme in the light of both a certain philosophical history and the contemporary literature in neuroscience. As this task suggests, it is the longest paper in the volume, and I couldn't possibly do it justice here. Just one remark about the opening gambit. Hopkins speaks of Quine and Davidson as 'explicating meaning via an imaginary scientific radical translator' (p. 116). Quine, maybe, but I found 'scientific' in connection with Davidson's project of radical interpretation somewhat puzzling. Nor is it a mere flourish: it seems to be the basis for linking Davidson's radical interpretation to a full-on scientific -- that is, neuroscientific and Bayesian -- project.

The final part of the volume consists of Platts' comments on the papers and a short note, 'Philosophical Life', setting out what he takes to be most important in the pursuing the vocation of philosophy. Platts' comments are titled 'Reflections and Replies', and this seems right, given that, as noted, a number of the papers do not involve detailed investigations of Platts' own published work. His recommendations about philosophical life come down to this: philosophers who are, as the French would say, serieux, should aim at truth, recognise the personal and hence private nature of philosophical work and should avoid the specialisation that defaces so much of academic philosophy. I have no argument with any of this.