Mind, Language, and Subjectivity: Minimal Content and the Theory of Thought

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Nicholas Georgalis, Mind, Language, and Subjectivity: Minimal Content and the Theory of Thought, Routledge, 2015, 260pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138795969.

Reviewed by Joe Y.F. Lau, The University of Hong Kong


Externalism is the thesis that our intentional mental states have "wide" contents. In other words, the content of these mental states fails to supervene on the purely "narrow" or intrinsic properties of the agent. This implies that two physically identical twins with the same brain state could actually possess different beliefs. Putnam and Burge have famously argued for externalism by trying to show how mental content depends on the social and physical environment. The upshot is that externalism is now a dominant position within the philosophy of mind. According to the 2009 PhilPapers survey, 51% of professional philosophers accept externalism, with 20% endorsing internalism, and 29% picking "other".

There is, however, a growing countercurrent against externalism. Authors who have recently defended internalism include Segal (2000), Chalmers (2002), Horgan and Tienson (2002), Mendola (2008), and Farkas (2008), to name just a few. Nicholas Georgalis's new book is a welcome addition to this camp, offering an original position that is bold and enticing. It is a development of his previous 2006 monograph, but the new book does not presuppose familiarity with the earlier work.

The centerpiece of Georgalis's framework is the notion of minimal content. The minimal content of an intentional mental state "represents the subject of the intentional state as the agent conceives it" (6). It is "a non-qualitative kind of narrow content" (2). Georgalis does not deny that the sentences we normally use to attribute beliefs have wide content, or what he calls "objective content". But he argues that these sentences often fail to capture correctly the minimal contents of our thought tokens. Minimal contents are essentially subjective and constituted by the agent. It is irreducible to a third-person account, but we do have privileged but fallible first-person access to them. According to Georgalis, recognizing their existence is crucial for understanding intentionality and for solving recalcitrant problems in the philosophy of mind and language.

The beginning one-third of the book consists of an exposition of minimal content and contrasting the new theory with other accounts, such as Frege's. The theory is then applied to various substitution problems in belief attribution, such as Kripke's Paderewski and London/Londres puzzles. It is also used to critique Keith Donnellan's referential/attributive distinction, and in developing a theory of proper names that is based on Searle (1958). In the last two chapters, it is argued that the subjective determinacy of minimal content offers a straight solution to the Kripkenstein challenge of grounding meaning, while also providing a rebuttal to Quine's indeterminacy of meaning argument.

The idea that narrow content captures how an agent subjectively conceives of the world is an attractive one. Consider Twin-Earth cases where physically-identical individuals are embedded in different social and physical environments. If we adopt the first-person perspective and project ourselves into their positions, it is tempting to agree there is a sense in which they take the world to be exactly the same way, and so we need to acknowledge a level of belief content that they share.

Of course, the difficult task is to develop this intuition further into a substantive theory of belief and meaning. To his credit Georgalis tries to do this, often in original and interesting ways. But there are also times when his explanations become problematic at crucial junctures. Here are some examples.

Georgalis holds a hybrid Millian/descriptivist account of proper names. The descriptivist aspect consists in the minimal content that a speaker associates with a proper name, which includes some of the conventional presuppositions used by the linguistic community to determine the referent of the name. The Millian aspect of the account is that the standard meaning or semantic content of the name is just the referent, and includes neither the minimal content nor the presuppositions.

The problem of empty names is a stumbling block for many Millian theories. Georgalis tackles the problem by considering the sentence "Vulcan does not exist". He says there is no planet that satisfies the conventional presuppositions associated with the name. The name "does not designate anything, and since that is what the sentence asserts, it is true" (192). This just seems too quick. First, it is people who make assertions, not sentences. Second, setting that aside, the response appears to commit a use/mention error. What the sentence says is that Vulcan does not exist. But it is not a metalinguistic claim about the English name "Vulcan". Georgalis himself insists that a proper name contributes only its referent to the semantic content and nothing else. So it is hard to see why the name should be part of the content of assertion. A similar problem applies to his analysis of the sentence "Santa Claus has a white beard". He says the sentence is meaningful, and the sentence asserts that having a white beard is one of the conventional presuppositions associated with the name (193). But if semantic content is the same as standard meaning (180), then an empty name would have no meaning, so why is the sentence still meaningful?

The other place where more clarity would be helpful is the discussion of meaning skepticism and the Kripkenstein paradox. Recall that the problem is finding some fact that would justify the claim that by "plus" an English speaker means addition rather than some incompatible bizarre function that is also consistent with her finite past usage. According to the skeptic, there is simply no fact about her that determines and justifies what she meant by "plus". Georgalis attacks this position by claiming that if we take into account the agent's learning history, it makes no sense to say that by "plus" she meant some bizarre function, because it would have required her to learn the deviant rule in the first place. But a deviant rule would have had to be formulated syntactically differently, and this is an objective fact that can easily be ascertained.

This response does not seem very convincing, because the whole point of the skeptic is that the same instruction could have been understood differently, with nothing in the finite past behavior that can distinguish the different interpretations. We might grant that the syntax of the verbal instruction is quite determinate, but why does this mean the instruction has to be understood in the standard as opposed to the bizarre manner? Insisting that learning the bizarre rule would require a different formulation appears to beg the question. In any case, Georgalis claims that his minimal content offers a straight solution to the Kripkenstein paradox. But it turns out that minimal content does not actually determine meaning. It only fixes meaning from among a set of viable alternatives (215). I suspect many people would not count this as a straight solution. Nonetheless, Georgalis's position here is quite interesting. He agrees with Quine on the indeterminacy of translation, which he takes to imply that words do not have a unique meaning and reference. But he thinks this is only true from the third-person perspective. From the first-person perspective, we are non-inferentially aware of the minimal content of our thoughts, and we intend our words to have particular meaning, and there is no indeterminacy.

Whether this asymmetric position is consistent and defensible remains to be seen. For example, if I say, "this sentence has a determinate meaning", this is presumably true from the first-person perspective, but false from the third-person perspective. So does Georgalis think that truth is relative? Also, we only have introspective access to our occurrent thoughts. Does this mean we have to adopt a third-person perspective with regard to our earlier self? If so, does it imply that meaning determinacy is only a fleeting phenomenon, in which case, what purpose does it serve? Furthermore, Georgalis rejects the view that meaning and understanding are associated with or constituted by distinctive qualitative experiences, unlike some philosophers who defend the idea of "phenomenal intentionality". But this suggests that our linguistic intentions are not conscious mental states by themselves. Perhaps we are only aware of the auditory or perceptual images they project into our consciousness, as suggested by Jackendoff (1987). Georgalis needs to provide an explanation of how we can know from introspection that minimal content is determinate, if in fact we lack direct conscious access to it.

More generally, a clearer account of the nature of minimal content is needed to evaluate the many major claims in the book. For example, Georgalis says that minimal content is supposed to be narrow, but this seems to be assumed and not directly argued for. There are of course other theories that explain narrow content in terms of internal computational/conceptual/functional roles. But Georgalis insists that minimal content is independent of symbol manipulation and so presumably rejects these accounts. One argument he offers against them is that two individuals can accept the same formal theory of arithmetic, although one takes the theory to be about natural numbers, and the other takes the theory to be about sets (12). The formal theories are symbolically the same, but their contents are different. I do not find this example very convincing, for the simple reason that the formal theory itself does not exhaust all the relevant syntactic or functional properties in the subjects' brains that can be used to differentiate them. After all, only one of them agrees with the statement "the formal theory is about sets". But setting this aside, if minimal content is not defined by functional properties, it is not clear what other intrinsic properties are available to function as its supervenience base. Perhaps neurophysiological ones? Georgalis says he rejects ontological questions about the nature of minimal content. I am not sure how he can show that minimal content is narrow without engaging with such questions.

According to Georgalis, minimal content is not just narrow content. It is also presupposed by and distinct from objective content. I have reservations about Georgalis's attempts to establish its special status. Officially, minimal content is content that "represents the subject of the intentional state as the agent conceives it" (6). Here, "subject" means the subject matter of the mental state, what the state is supposed to be about. On one interpretation of this definition, minimal content is the content of a meta-belief about what the agent thinks is the subject of a lower-order intentional state. But Georgalis makes it clear this is not what he has in mind, and obviously this notion of meta-content cannot be more basic than ordinary objective content.

The alternative intended interpretation is as follows. Suppose the intentional state in question is a belief. Its minimal content is intended to capture the way in which the agent conceives of those things the belief is about. To use Georgalis's own example, imagine there is a kumquat on the table and Sam mistakenly believes it is an orange. So Sam has a false belief about the kumquat. But Georgalis says that "when we are interested in what Sam's thought is subjectively about, what is relevant is the minimal content of his thought, in this case an orange" (28).

There are a few issues here worth clarifying. First, minimal content represents the subject of the belief as the agent conceives it. The subject of Sam's belief as he conceives it is an orange. But then the minimal content ought to be something that represents the orange, and not the orange itself. In some other places though (xi, 40), Georgalis says minimal content is the subject matter of the belief as conceived by the agent, and there is no mention of representation. So perhaps the orange is indeed part of the minimal content. However, Georgalis also asserts in those same passages that minimal content is constituted by the agent. But how can an orange be part of the agent? This is partly a terminological issue, but it does call for a clearer explanation of the structure and composition of minimal content. In any case, a bigger worry is that if minimal content can be specified with natural kind terms such as "orange", then might it not turn out to be wide rather than narrow, given the externalist arguments from Putnam and Burge?

More importantly, although the example given motivates the need to understand how an agent conceives of the world subjectively, it fails to show that what is needed is a completely new kind of content. After all, we can describe how Sam conceives of the world by saying things like "Sam believes there is an orange on the table". The same might be said with regard to Georgalis's other example. He says that when a physicist assents to "up quarks have color" (41), the minimal content of his thought-token is very different from that of a layman because of the physicist's richer understanding. However, presumably the richer understanding comes down to a set of beliefs about particle physics. Whereas the layman's beliefs might be restricted to contents expressed by sentences such as "there are these tiny particles in physics known as 'quarks'", "those things physicists call 'quarks' have a property they call 'up'", "I have no idea how quarks are different from atoms", etc. It seems that such sentences collectively reveal how the agent conceives of the subject of his belief, but this does not require a new theory of content. Perhaps Georgalis thinks that minimal content cannot be captured even when we resort to metalinguistic or phenomenal language. This would suggest that narrow content is radically inexpressible in natural language, as Fodor (1987) claims. But then Georgalis would be wrong to say that Sam's minimal content contains an orange. He also has to give up the claim that minimal content and objective content often coincide, as in the case of the physicist.

As mentioned at the beginning of this review, there is an increasing number of philosophers who reject externalism. Georgalis's framework stands out as a bold and original alternative. The insistence that we need to take the first-person perspective seriously is powerfully motivated. But despite the fact that this is his second book on minimal content, I find myself at a loss as to what minimal content is supposed to be. If Georgalis wants to win more converts to his cause, he might have to engage with the ontological questions about minimal content more directly.


Chalmers, David (2002) The Components of Content. In Chalmers (ed.) Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 608-633 (2002).

Farkas, Katalin (2008) The Subject's Point of View. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Jerry Fodor (1987) Psychosemantics. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Georgalis, Nicholas (2006) The Primacy of the Subjective: Foundations for a Unified Theory of Mind and Language. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Terence Horgan and John Tienson (2002) The Intentionality of Phenomenology and the Phenomenology of Intentionality. In David J. Chalmers (ed.), Philosophy of Mind: Classical and Contemporary Readings. Oxford: Oxford University Press. 520-533 (2002).

Jackendoff, Ray (1987) Consciousness and the Computational Mind. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Mendola, Joseph (2008) Anti-Externalism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Searle, John (1958) Proper Names. Mind 67: 166-173.

Segal, Gabriel (2000) A Slim Book about Narrow Content. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.