Mind, Method, and Morality: Essays in Honour of Anthony Kenny

Placeholder book cover

John Cottingham and Peter Hacker (eds.), Mind, Method, and Morality: Essays in Honour of Anthony Kenny, Oxford UP, 2010, 391pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556120.

Reviewed by Robert Pasnau, University of Colorado at Boulder



No one, not even a scholar as distinguished as Anthony Kenny, could ask for a more handsome published tribute than this: sixteen essays by first-class scholars, ranging over the full spectrum of Kenny’s historical interests, each offering its own personal homage to the honoree before embarking on historical scholarship of the highest order. The volume is neatly divided into four groups of four:

1. Essays on Aristotle by Sarah Broadie, Jonathan Barnes, David Charles, and Christopher Shields.

2. Essays on Aquinas by Terence Irwin, John Haldane, David Oderberg, and Brian Davies.

3. Essays on Descartes by Desmond Clarke, John Cottingham, Stephen Gaukroger, and Marleen Rozemond.

4. Essays on Wittgenstein by Peter Hacker, Hans-Johann Glock, Joachim Schulte, and Severin Schroeder.

All of this is sandwiched between the editors’ preface, which surveys Kenny’s career, and a comprehensive bibliography of Kenny’s writings. A look at either of these is likely to surprise even the most confirmed of Kenny’s fans with its account of just how much he has written (and is still writing) over such a wide range of topics. If there are few readers out there who will be interested in the full range of topics covered here, that must count not as a criticism of this volume, but as another form of tribute to the inimitable range of Kenny’s work.

As the editors point out, and as several subsequent contributions underscore, much of Kenny’s earliest work was not historical at all, but rather devoted to topics in the philosophy of mind and action. Even so, this volume’s historical focus reflects the side of Kenny’s work that has had the most influence, and that he has most persistently cultivated. He himself — as prolific with respect to his own history as he is in other domains — has offered a remarkably forthright explanation of why he made this turn:

In my first years as a professional philosopher, I attempted to make original discoveries in … areas such as … the theory of action… . After I had written a few books in this area, however, I realized that I was not able enough to compete with the best of my philosophical colleagues. I came to see that the best contribution I could make to the subject was to provide introductions, in contemporary terms, to the great philosophers of the past (as quoted in Cottingham’s contribution to this volume, p. 208n).

It is hard to know what to marvel at most here, the notion that Kenny turned away from “original discoveries” because he could not “compete with the best” (how many of us can?), or else that what he did instead was simply to “provide introductions” to various historical figures (as if he has been busily writing textbooks for Wadsworth).

Each of these sixteen chapters follows the scholarly agenda that Kenny set for himself, and, indeed, helped set for historians of philosophy everywhere — not to write “introductions,” to be sure, but to approach the study of philosophy’s history with the same sort of analytic rigor ordinarily applied to “original” research. Although the quality of the chapters is not as uniformly high as one finds in top peer-reviewed journals, the volume offers by way of compensation a good many distinguished scholars whose work is not likely to be found in such venues. At the same time, quite a few of the chapters suffer from that familiar form of academic sclerosis that causes senior scholars to rely increasingly on their own earlier published work, at the expense of others’ research, so that their footnotes became a kind of sublinear curriculum vitae. Even so, this is clearly the sort of volume that will get pulled off the library shelf for decades to come, as readers discover one or another good thing in it, and from there discover some other good thing in the very next chapter.

The first two parts of the book are rather diverse in their topics. In Part One, Broadie offers a close reading of Eudemian Ethics VIII.3, on the good and the noble. Barnes discusses the concept of destiny as it features in Alexander of Aphrodisias. Charles focuses on akrasia in Aristotle. Shields offers an account of the nature of Aristotelian actuality. In Part Two, Irwin grapples with the proliferation of discrete stages in Aquinas’s theory of action. Haldane considers the status of mind in Aquinas. Oderberg heroically attempts to defend the First Way, and Davies discusses the nature of action in God. The chapters in Part Three all focus on the Cartesian mind: Clarke on the character of Descartes’s dualism; Cottingham on free will; Gaukroger on perception and moral sensibility; Rozemond on the mind’s simplicity and immortality. The essays in Part Four, though written by a less uniformly imposing group of contributors, have the compensating advantage of a unified focus, all revolving around Wittgenstein’s work in philosophical psychology: Hacker offers a detailed account of its career-long development; Glock proposes a theory of concepts; Schulte focuses on the early writings; Schroeder takes up the perceiving of aspects.

Out of the vast range of topics and periods canvassed in this volume, I want to single out two interesting claims, both of which, as it happens, pertain to Descartes. First, Gaukroger considers in some detail the question of whether, for Descartes, non-human animals can be said to perceive. His answer is Yes. Whether this is the right answer will surely depend — as Gaukroger would doubtless agree — on exactly how we define ‘perception.’ Sometimes Descartes applies perceptual language to animals, and sometimes he does not. Gaukroger himself suggests a very interesting way to try to make the issues here more precise, when he asks whether, for Descartes, animals can perceive color. Gaukroger’s answer is that they can, and that indeed “no one in the seventeenth century even raised the question of whether animals might not see the world as coloured” (p. 245). Whether or not the issue was explicitly discussed, it is certainly an interesting one to consider, if for no other reason than that it has a large bearing on whether we should say that animals perceive at all. After all, when one keeps in mind that the grayscale counts here as a color, it is hard (though perhaps not impossible?) to defend the thesis that animals perceive, but do not in any way perceive colors.

If colors are thought to be out in the world, then there seems no in-principle difficulty in allowing other animals to perceive them. (I will take for granted, following Gaukroger, that in some sense animals do perceive.) There is a case to be made that Descartes thinks colors are in the world — after all, he sometimes says this (e.g., in the Regulae, the Discourse, the Optics) — but the more common reading, accepted by Gaukroger, treats Descartes as denying that colors are in the world. Here is where the question about other animals becomes most interesting. One might suppose that, if colors are not in the world, then surely animals cannot perceive them. Consider the case of Galileo, who famously claims that colors reside only “in consciousness.” Combine this view with the usual reading of Descartes on which animals are denied consciousness, and it would seem to follow that animals cannot perceive colors. Actually, however, what Galileo says in the The Assayer is not that color resides in consciousness, as the standard English translation has it, but that they reside "nel corpo sensitivo." This would seem to leave plenty of room for other animals to perceive colors. What the colors are, on this view, would be physical phenomena within the right sort of perceptual faculties, caused by certain patterns of light in the world. In effect, this is how Gaukroger reads Descartes. On his view, “the natural world is colourless,” but color results from the way our eyes physically interact with the surfaces of objects: “indeed, colour enhancement in visual cognition is a paradigm psycho-physiological operation” (p. 245). Thus there is no problem with animal color vision.

This understanding of color is interestingly positioned between the two principal views on the topic: either that colors are on the surfaces of objects, or that they are phenomenal states. This compromise position accounts for the well-known arguments against color realism on the grounds of sensory variation and observer dependence. It also has the advantage, at least from the seventeenth-century perspective, of allowing a physical treatment of color, rather than requiring that colors be put in the notorious dustbin of the mind. Even so, I am doubtful whether this is right about Descartes. Certainly, some seventeenth-century authors want to treat colors as conscious, mental phenomena. According to Malebranche, for instance, “the heat we sense and the colors we see are only in the soul” (Search after Truth VI.2.2). Since animals, for Malebranche, have no souls, they cannot perceive colors. This seems to be Descartes’s view as well, at least in those places where he wants to locate colors in perceivers rather than in the world. Both the Meditations and the Principles argue that colors, strictly speaking, are not out in the world but are instead our sensations. This much of course leaves open the question of what to say about other animals. But when Descartes speaks in this context of sensation, he seems to have in mind the sort of thing that only a mind can do — that is, he is treating sensation as a kind of thought. This, at any rate, is what the Fifth Replies say: “colors, smells, tastes, and so on are merely certain sensations existing in my thought” (VII:440). It is also what the Principles says: “what we call the sensations of tastes, smells, sounds, heat, cold, light, colors, and so on — sensations that do not represent anything located outside our thought” (I.71).

It is not hard to see why it seemed important to Descartes (and others) to bring colors all the way into the mind, and not only into the sensory organs. A considerable part of what motivates seventeenth-century theories of the secondary qualities is the notion that such qualities are essentially defined in terms of their having a certain sort of phenomenal appearance. But from here it seems to follow quite quickly that nothing outside the mind can possibly have a phenomenal look — the world does not resemble the mind in these respects. In suggesting that non-conscious animals can perceive colors, Gaukroger ignores this important dimension of the seventeenth-century debate over secondary qualities.

The second claim I wish to consider in some detail arises in the course of Marleen Rozemond’s discussion of a much-discussed passage from the Synopsis to the Meditations:

The premises that lead to the conclusion that the soul is immortal depend on an account of the whole of physics. This is required for two reasons. First, we need to know that absolutely all substances, or things that must be created by God in order to exist, are by their nature incorruptible and cannot ever cease to exist unless they are reduced to nothingness by God’s denying his concurrence to them. Secondly, we need to recognize that body, taken in general, is a substance, so that it too never perishes. But the human body, in so far as it differs from other bodies, is simply made up of a certain configuration of limbs and other accidents of this sort, whereas the human mind is not made up of any accidents in this way, but is a pure substance (VII:13-14).

Descartes is here trying to explain why the Meditations does not attempt to establish the soul’s immortality, and how he thinks such an argument might nevertheless go. The passage has been the subject of considerable commentary in recent years, because of its suggestive remarks about the status of material substances. Some read the passage as an indication that Descartes is a material monist, treating all of res extensa as just a single, incorruptible substance. Rozemond, rightly in my view, rejects this understanding of Descartes, but her concern here is with a less-remarked part of the passage: why Descartes should think that “an account of the whole of physics” is required to establish the soul’s immortality. Her answer, developed over six carefully-argued pages (264-69), is that physics for Descartes is the key to the rejection of substantial form, and that the rejection of substantial form is the key to proving the soul’s immortality.

This seems to me a good start toward understanding what Descartes is up to, but only a start. The above passage, though convoluted in its structure, can be stripped down to one very simple argument:

1. Pure substances are incorruptible.

2. The mind (or soul) is a pure substance

3. ∴ The mind is incorruptible (i.e., immortal).

What a “pure substance” is, in the context of this passage, is a matter of considerable controversy, but I think Rozemond and I are in agreement that the pure substances are the fundamental entities in Descartes’s ontology, from which other “things,” like the human body, are somehow temporarily constructed. Why we should accept premise 1 — that these fundamental entities are incorruptible — is quite unclear, and Rozemond offers no help here. But she thinks that Descartes invokes physics at this point to narrow the pool of candidates for the title of pure substance, by excluding substantial forms. This much is surely right. From the vantage point of 1641, the most likely scenario on which the human soul would turn out not to be immortal is one on which the soul turns out to be a soul like the souls of other animals — that is, the kind of substantial form whose existence depends on the existence of the body, and which comes and goes as the animal’s body does. Scholastic proofs of the soul’s immortality tried to draw a distinction between substantial forms of that kind and the kind of substantial form that includes a mind. Descartes’s strategy, Rozemond rightly argues, is instead to reject the category of substantial form entirely, by offering an improved physics.

My only objection is that there is still more to the story. Descartes would need to set out “the whole of physics” to make his argument run, because the argument must reject every candidate for mind that would threaten premise 2. This means not just ruling out corruptible substantial forms, but also ruling out all the other candidates for mind that one or another fanciful metaphysics has postulated as perishable constituents of the world. Accidents, for instance, are perishable, and so a proof of the mind’s immortality must be able to rule this out as a possibility for what the mind is. Descartes’s physics does so, of course, not by showing that the soul is not an accident, but by showing that there are no accidents. Descartes must also — and here is where things become really interesting — reject composite bodies as a candidate for the mind. Scholastic authors did this, typically, by arguing for the mind’s immateriality. The fascinating implication of the Synopsis passage is that Descartes would argue against the mind’s corporeality in a radically different way — not by showing it to be immaterial, but by undermining the reality of ordinary bodies. This too is evidently the job of physics: to show that ordinary bodies (e.g., the human body) are not the fundamental entities, and that instead the fundamental entities on the side of res extensa are the enduring constituents of such bodies. Since Descartes is not an atomist, it is not immediately obvious at what level he thinks we have the pure substances of res extensa. (This is part of what drives some toward taking Descartes to be a material monist.) However that story is to go, Descartes’s concern here is only to rule out yet another possibility for what the mind might be: the mind is not a composite body.

Most basically, then, the immortality argument sketched in the Synopsis proceeds by establishing through physics that the basic constituents in the world are not the sorts of constituents postulated either by scholastic metaphysics or by commonsense. They are, instead, the incorruptible building blocks of God’s creation. If one grants the passage’s underlying assumption that the human mind is one of those basic constituents, then Descartes can establish the mind’s immortality without even needing to establish its immateriality. Whether or not the mind counts as a body, it is a fundamental entity, and that is all this argument needs. Since the Meditations aims instead at immateriality, via the famous real-distinction argument, the Synopsis argument for immortality requires a different foundation altogether, one grounded in a complete and reductive theory of physics.