Minimizing Marriage: Marriage, Morality, and the Law

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Elizabeth Brake, Minimizing Marriage: Marriage, Morality, and the Law, Oxford University Press, 2012, 240pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199774142.

Reviewed by Ralph Wedgwood, University of Southern California


Elizabeth Brake's book, Minimizing Marriage, is an in-depth examination of marriage, within the context of contemporary ethical and political theory. Brake ultimately argues for a radical reform -- which she calls "minimal marriage" -- in which there would be virtually no restrictions on the gender or number of persons involved in a marriage, or on the type of relationship that these persons have. In her view, any more restrictive form of marriage would be illiberal and unjust.

The topic of Brake's book is clearly of fundamental importance. Marriage is an extraordinarily familiar and well-known institution, which touches the lives of almost everyone. Many people make having a successful marriage one of their most central aspirations, and almost everyone who does not aspire to be married is aware that in this respect they differ from most of their fellow-citizens. Questions about marriage are also prominent in contemporary politics, where the debate about whether to allow same-sex marriage provokes persistent disagreement.

However, contemporary political philosophy has had surprisingly little to say about marriage. This seems to be because contemporary political philosophy has been overwhelmingly concerned with distributive justice and with democratic politics. So, aside from emphasizing that marriage institutions need to be structured in such a way that they do not impose unfair burdens on women (or indeed on anyone else), political philosophers have had little to say about marriage.

This is regrettable, because marriage is a philosophically puzzling institution. Why should the state be involved in marriage at all? What legitimate state purpose (if any) does marriage serve? A good philosophical understanding of marriage would help us to understand whether or not marriage should ultimately be abolished or reformed, and if so, how. Brake's book is a searching and sophisticated treatment of these crucial questions.

In Part One ("Demoralizing Marriage"), Brake focuses on the ethical significance of marriage for the individuals involved. Chapter 1 discusses whether marriage involves a promise. First, she argues that the typical marriage vows -- "to love, honour, and cherish, until death us do part" -- cannot literally be taken as promises. It is not clear that we can promise love at all. If we could, it would follow, counter-intuitively, that divorce counts as promise-breaking. Then she considers what strikes me as a more plausible suggestion, that when you get married to another person, you promise to be that person's spouse, in exchange for that person promising you to be your spouse. On this account, the marriage promise is the "undertaking of a public status and social role" (p. 40). However, Brake brushes this suggestion aside with the following objection: "given diverse understandings of what the spousal role entails, its content can only be specified by the intentions of the people getting married . . . In a multicultural, multireligious society, not all spouses will understand their roles in the same way" (p. 40). So, she concludes, "there is no single essential marriage promise that all spouses make" (p. 41).

Brake's objection to this more plausible account of the marriage promise seems to me much too quick. When I promise to take on the public status of being your spouse, it is not my idiosyncratic views or intentions that determine what it is for me to have the public status of being your spouse, but whatever public understanding of this role is genuinely shared throughout our society. Even if our society is profoundly multicultural and multireligious, there could still be a core understanding of marriage that really is shared throughout our society. Brake never gives any convincing argument that this is not how things actually are even in our own pluralistic society.

In Chapter 2, Brake discusses the idea that marriage involves a commitment. Here she argues that the external social status of marriage need not bring with it any corresponding internal commitment; at best, marriage provides a social form for expressing commitments, and creates pressure to keep commitments. Anyway, the value of a commitment depends on the value of whatever it is that the individual is committed to. There is, for example, no value in being committed to a mutually harmful abusive relationship. So the appeal to commitment does not by itself explain the ethical significance of marriage. In Chapter 3, Brake discusses some of the more conservative defences of traditional marriage, such as those that have been articulated by the natural law theorist John Finnis or by the conservative political philosopher Roger Scruton. Here she objects, cogently it seems to me, that these conservative theorists never provide any convincing account of why the legal institution of marriage is so important for the distinctive marital virtues that they celebrate.

In Chapter 4, Brake broaches a theme that becomes important throughout the rest of the book -- namely, caring interpersonal relationships. Such caring relationships are intrinsically valuable, she argues, at least as long as they are characterized by justice and respect for the relevant parties' rights. However, although traditional marriage as we know it may support some caring relationships, it also privileges relationships of a certain kind -- romantic amorous relationships between two people. This in a way discriminates against single people, since marriage encourages the attitude that single people are somewhat pathetic figures. Moreover, there are many other valuable caring relationships -- most notably, friendships, but also the relationships of "adult care networks" (p. 90), "polyamorists" (p. 91), and "urban tribes" (p 92). These non-amorous relationships are marginalized, and to that extent undermined, by the special privilege that marriage accords to amorous relationships. This marginalization of non-amorous caring relationships is what Brake calls "amatonormative discrimination" (p. 97); as she argues, the institution of marriage as it currently exists promotes such amatonormative discrimination.

One minor problem with this chapter is that Brake seems to be suggesting that the sort of amatonormative discrimination fostered by our current marriage institutions perpetrates serious harms. But this suggestion really needs more empirical evidence to support it than she provides. Nonetheless, even if this sort of discrimination does not cause serious harms, it is still plausible that such discrimination is wrong, and so it would be preferable if the institution of marriage could be reformed in such a way that it no longer supports such discrimination.

Part Two ("Democratizing Marriage") shifts from the ethical questions about the moral significance of marriage for the individuals involved to political questions about how our social and legal institutions should be structured. In Chapter 5, she canvases a range of criticisms of marriage -- especially, the feminist criticisms of such theorists as Simone de Beauvoir, Susan Moller Okin, and Claudia Card, who have argued that marriage disadvantages women, and facilitates domestic violence and abuse. In spite of its disturbing history, however, Brake suggests that marriage may not be essentially inimical to women; it may be possible to reform marriage so that it is no longer unjust in these ways.

Chapter 6 considers the contemporary debate between legal and political philosophers about same-sex marriage. Within the context of liberal political theory, all attempts to justify the restriction of marriage to opposite-sex couples have failed. Child welfare is sometimes offered as a reason for restricting marriage, but in fact we need to acknowledge that there are two distinct family relationships that are both recognized by the law -- marriage and parenthood. The reasons for recognizing these two relationships seem quite different, and so at least to begin with, we should consider each aspect of family law separately. If there are any reasons for yoking these two institutions together, they need to be clearly stated and justified rather than simply assumed.

However, Brake also argues that "liberal defences of same-sex marriage have not followed the implications of their reasoning far enough" (p. 6). The same considerations that show that there is no legitimate rationale for restricting marriage to opposite-sex couples also show that there is no legitimate rationale for restricting it to "amatonormative relationships" -- that is, to relationships between couples that are presumed to be romantic or amorous. So even if restricting marriage to opposite-sex couples, and excluding same-sex couples, is unjust discrimination, perhaps the best way to eliminate this discrimination is by simply abolishing marriage altogether?

In Chapter 7, Brake argues that marriage can be reformed in a way that avoids these objections. This chapter -- which is in a way the culmination of the argument of the whole book -- contains Brake's positive conception of the sort of marriage that would exist in an ideally just society. Her argument relies on the Rawlsian principle that a liberal political system must not justify its social and legal institutions on the basis of any controversial doctrines or ideals, but only on the basis of the kind of "public reason" that all reasonable citizens can endorse. From the standpoint of public reason, we can all accept that caring relationships are intrinsically good, and that our social institutions should support such relationships. However, there is no non-controversial argument in favour of restricting such support to amatonormative relationships.

So, Brake infers, marriage should be radically reconfigured so that there are no restrictions on the either gender or the number of the people who are involved in a marriage. Also there should be no restrictions on the kinds of spousal obligations that the people involved in the marriage exchange with each other (in particular, there should not be any presumption that these spousal rights and obligations should always be broadly reciprocal). This sort of "minimal marriage" should go along with the entitlement to a range of state benefits (such as health insurance benefits, immigration benefits, prison and hospital visitation rights, the right not to be compelled to testify against one's spouse, and so on), since such benefits clearly and non-controversially support caring relationships. But it should not involve any more restrictions on what the marriage is like. Such restrictions would be illiberal, since they could only be justified on the basis of controversial doctrines and ideals.

In my view, Brake is quite right that these sorts of state benefits should be distributed in whatever way best supports caring relationships, and that it is important to recognize that caring relationships come in many different shapes and sizes. However, I do not see why these benefits should be essentially tied to marriage. Marriage, as I see it, is essentially a public social role, defined by the core understanding of marriage that is shared throughout society. The main ways in which the law underpins this social role is not through these extra benefits that the state happens to attach to marriage, but simply through the fact that marriage is a legal status (that is, whether or not you are married is a question that can be settled by a court of law), and by the broadly standardized package of mutual obligations that spouses have towards each other under the law. In my view, the core of our shared public understanding of marriage is this: (a) marriage is a relationship between two people (even a polygamist like Abraham had one marriage with Sarah, and a second separate marriage with Hagar); and (b) typically (though not invariably), marriages involve sexual relations between the two spouses, and some form of cooperation in dealing with the domestic and economic necessities of life.

So, given my understanding of marriage, Brake's conclusion is really that what we mean by 'marriage' should be abolished, and the word 'marriage' should be subversively redeployed to refer to any legally recognized adult caring relationship. This point is not a substantial criticism of Brake. On the contrary, Brake's argument poses a formidable challenge for any defence of any ("more-than-minimal") marriage. How can one justify marriage institutions of this kind without justifying amatonormative discrimination -- and how can one justify amatonormative discrimination without relying on controversial doctrines or ideals that some citizens will reasonably reject? While I believe that Brake is too quick to conclude that there is no way in which any defender of "more-than-minimal" marriage can answer this challenge, she has done us all a service by articulating the challenge so clearly.

In the last chapter, Brake emphasizes that her conception of "minimal marriage" is really only designed for an ideally just liberal egalitarian society. She recognizes that trying to implement minimal marriage immediately in our imperfect society could cause serious harms for economically vulnerable people, especially women. She suggests that during the transition to a more just society, it may be defensible to maintain some more-than-minimal restrictions on marriage. In the transitional period, however, it will be important to combat sexist, heterosexist and amatonormative discrimination in other ways.

For reasons that I have sketched above, not all of the book's arguments strike me as completely convincing. Nonetheless, it is by far the most sophisticated and challenging discussion of marriage known to me by any contemporary political philosopher. It should be  required reading for every political philosopher, and for every philosopher who is seriously interested in marriage.