Models of God and Alternative Ultimate Realities

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Jeanine Diller and Asa Kasher (eds.), Models of God and Alternative Ultimate Realities, Springer, 2013, 1041pp., $279.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400752184.

Reviewed by Kelly James Clark, Grand Valley State University


What did I learn from reading and writing a review of this book? Partly the wisdom of Nancy Reagan: "Just say, 'No!'" The next time NDPR asks me to review an over 1,000-page book containing roughly 100 different essays, just say, "No!" That's my new philosophy. By not saying, "No," though, I learned more than I could possibly have imagined about, for example, Hegelian panentheism, highest clarity Daoism, and Ardhanarisvara's androgynous model of God. That said, I may have learned more than I wanted or needed.

The aim of the book, which began as a workshop at an APA meeting, is to explore, critique and compare "the major philosophical models of God" (1) and, as if that weren't enough, alternative ultimate realities, and to discuss such models and our understanding of models per se. The book is strongest on the exploration part, the parts where authors present their own views or expound those of historically famous thinkers such as Spinoza, Al-Ghazali or Hume. It is decidedly weaker on critique, comparison and conceptual clarification.

The book is organized around conceptual models rather than religions. For example, the section on classical theism contains essays on Aristotelian, Jewish, Christian and Muslim conceptions of God; the section on panentheism contains essays on Nicholas of Cusa, Kant, Schelling, Hegel, Pierce and Rahner, with a reflection on Hindu gods, to boot. The remaining sections are Conceptual Foundations, Neo-classical Theism, Open Theism, Process Theology, Ground, Start and End of Being Theologies, Ultimate Unity, Divine Multiplicity, Naturalistic Models of the Infinite, Against Modeling: Negative Theology, Diversity of Models of God and Alternative Ultimate Realities, and Practical Implications (except for Pamela Sue Anderson's essay on feminist conceptions of God, it is unclear why this latter section was thrown in).

"Model" is construed broadly to include everything from accounts of the nature of ultimate reality through metaphors to "indexical signs" of an indeterminate ultimate reality. What, given "model" thus broadly construed, are the major models of God and ultimate reality around the world (and historically)? Given the plethora of recent work in Christian philosophical theology, one might have expected a Christian models of God book. While Diller and Kasher originally sought monotheistic models of God, they expanded to include polytheisms, non-theistic religions, and even a-theisms. Hence, the bulky title. One thing for certain, this book is encyclopedic. I will not discuss all the essays but will give the reader a sense of the book as a whole (along with its strengths and weaknesses).

The opening conceptual section, which discusses models more systematically, addresses the questions: "How do we map the God/ultimate reality terrain (what are models)?," "What is the map of the God/ultimate reality terrain (have we an exhaustive set of possibilities)?," and "Can we know where on the map of the God/ultimate reality terrain we should make our own home (can we know which among the possibilities is true)?"

The book seems to take a surprisingly wrong turn right at the beginning. Robert Neville argues, in a rather neo-Kantian vein, that ultimate reality is indeterminate and so cannot be modeled (determined) by human beings. One wonders, then, how he can claim that our models of determinate reality (elements in our world) -- persons, states of consciousness, and emergence -- could possibly serve as signs or pointers to ultimate reality. Lawrence Whitney's Nevillian skepticism about modeling ultimate reality likewise carries along with it a Kantian agnosticism about the nature of ultimate reality (though we can, Whitney contends, model the boundary between ultimate indeterminate reality and our determinate world). Thankfully, for a book that aims to discuss models of God, these two essays, which eschew models, are among the weakest of the bunch. Whitehead argued that there are 32 possible permutations of divine properties: eternality, temporality, consciousness, knowledge of the world, etc. Donald Viney shows Whitehead's failure of imagination: with just a few additions of possible divine properties, such as divine creativity, there are 256 alternatives for ultimate reality! Viney thus raises the issue of "unexplored alternatives" for thinking about ultimate reality. Michael Antony offers a clever argument that we might be able, for all we know, to acquire knowledge of ultimate reality and that, moreover, it is rational to hope that we can. We don't yet have much sense of what a model is, but we do know that there are at least 256 of them and that we might know, if Neville and Whitney are wrong, which of them is true.

Classical theism. After R. Michael Olson's nimble discussion of Aristotle's theology (of a first and unmoved mover who is also the final cause), Elliot Dorff reminds us of the Jewish prohibition against idolatry, which would motivate Maimonides' negative theology (and its problems and prospects for imaging God). John Peter Kenney, Katherin Rogers, Robert Kennedy and Eric Silverman return us to the Aristotelian classical God of Augustine, Anselm and Aquinas as immutable, timelessly eternal, impassible, perfect and, perhaps most fundamentally, simple. Al-Ghazali and Ibn Rushd likewise, according to Ali Hasan, struggled to fashion a positive Quranic theology that would both affirm transcendence and avoid anthropomorphism.

We have four traditions -- Greek, Jewish, Christian, and Muslim -- that share metaphysical and theological concerns and intuitions, and at various points roughly converge on a single, classical notion of God. And yet there are deep differences, ones that suggest a certain plasticity or even relativity of concepts and values. Epistemic differences are likewise deep. How is reality known? Through experience (Augustine and al-Ghazali), prayer (Augustine and Anselm), a priori argument (Anselm), a posteriori arguments (everyone), scripture (everyone but Aristotle), nothing (John Bishop, in a later chapter), practice (William James and Bishop, in later chapters), and/or mysticism (al-Ghazali)? Does transcendence preclude any human comprehension of God, entailing that God is the something we know not what? And if theological skepticism is thought avoidable, how are human concepts, images, and metaphors capable of grasping non-human reality? These sorts of issues raise their heads throughout each section but are seldom discussed.

Neoclassical and open theism. Neoclassical and open theism affirm perfect being theology while rejecting Anselm's precise specification of great-making properties. In one of the volume's best papers, Yujin Nagasawa, based on the problem of evil, rejects Anselm's OmniGod (God as omnipotent, omniscient and omnibenevolent) in favor of a Maximal God (God has a maximally consistent set of knowledge, power and benevolence). In general, it seems that non-classical theists are moved by various problems of evil considerations. How could a perfectly good God sovereignly will, say, the Holocaust? Or, how could a perfectly good God foreknow the holocaust and not prevent it? Open theists, for their part, reject the meticulous providence (God ultimate wills everything) and exhaustive Foreknowledge of classical theists (and so, as David Woodruff argues, God takes risks). Alan Rhoda argues that open theism offers a more adequate model of divine power than does process theism.

Process theology and panentheism. Probably because I knew the least about process theism, I found this section the most interesting and, at the same time, the most frustrating. Roland Faber's informative introduction set the stage for understanding a Whiteheadian/Jamesian theism based on pure experience. James's finite theism, according to Jonathan Weidenbaum, creates metaphysical space for human freedom while motivating and empowering our occasionally disheartening struggle against suffering. Philip Clayton's introduction to panentheism considers how God could be both immanent ("the world is contained within the divine") and transcendent ("God is also more than the world"). Stephen Palmquist's remarkably clear (that is unKantian) exposition of Kant's religious views as panentheistic contained such little known gems as "in his younger adult years he [Kant] sometimes preached in a country church" (400) and Kant "explicitly confesses that he must believe in God and a future life in order to prevent himself from 'becoming abhorrent in my own eyes'" (403). Whether or not Kant was a panentheist, Palmquist squashes the fashionable claim that Kant was not a theist. Glenn Magee's essay on Hegel made Hegel seem more like a process theist than a panentheist (and, even after reading all of the other essays in these two sections, made me wonder whether or not I really understood the difference). After setting aside Pierce's "gnarly neologisms" (433), Jeffrey Kasser offers a fascinating and reasonably coherent picture of Pierce's religious cosmology (and why it's not just an idle afterthought to his more widely accepted philosophical views). One conceptual problem for process thought: if experience is that which most fundamentally exists, how do we get beyond (my) human experience to divine reality?

Brief interlude. I'm not even up to page 500, and I'm wearing out; I've already read nearly forty, very different essays. This is not to the book's credit. The book could have and maybe should have ended at this point, with the editors offering some critical and constructive remarks about what a discussion and defense of these various theistic models amount to. What is the philosopher, for example, allowed to take as data? Opinions have varied from pure experience alone to Scripture alone. Did talking about models help in any way? Is talk about models per se, for example, somehow regulative of human thought? In short, what is the purpose of the book and has it achieved its purpose? Are we any closer . . . to what? At the end of 500 pages, I'm not sure (because I'm not exactly sure what the purpose is). Why did the authors not relate their essays to the initial chapters on conceptual foundations? What was the purpose of those chapters except for those authors to defend their own models of ultimate reality? At any rate, the first half of the book would make a fine introduction to those wishing to gain a wide understanding of various models of roughly monotheistic models of God. There is some discussion of models in section XII with Wesley J. Wildman's essay, one that critiques anthropomorphic models, one of the few that engages the limitations of models in useful and insightful ways.

Grab bag thoughts on the remaining essays. It's hard to know what to say about essays on topics that range from Levinas's non-existent god to Ibn 'Arabi's ultimate model of the ultimate. And it's hard to find common themes -- the editors were driven to title one section, "Ground, Start and End of Being Theologies." This section includes start of being, end of being, as well as start and end of being theologies. Tillich, who once preached, "God can reveal himself only by remaining veiled," managed to keep his own views veiled under his "ground of being" rhetoric. Little wonder his views have been variously interpreted as theistic, deistic, pantheistic, panentheistic, and atheistic. I'm not sure how well the various authors clarified ground of being theology's (deliberately?) obscure language.

Frankly, I found most of the papers on negative theology thin, and, upon reflection, that seemed quite appropriate. How much can one really say about a reality that cannot be known? I suppose the less said, the better.

Rita M. Gross discusses the perplexing issue of ultimates (gods?) in Buddhism. While it is fashionable to say that Buddhists, following the Buddha, are atheists, one finds in the actual practice of Buddhism a surprising number of gods (and in some cases a conscious, heaven-like afterlife). It seems to me that Gross's discussion of Buddhism, and maybe any number of other papers, might have profited from a discussion of the cognitive science of religion, which suggests that humans are hard-wired to conceive of Reality in various predictable ways. Except for a few esoterics who spend their entire lives training to overcome thinking in such categories, how many actual religious believers (not highly trained theologians or, again, esoterics) can conceive of God as a non-person? And when we talk about Buddhism and Buddhist conceptions of reality, whose Buddhism are we talking about? The simple and esoteric teachings of the Buddha or the living tradition that has both been informed by and departed from those teachings? One thing is certain: the book would have profited from an engagement with issues in cognitive science of religion. Again, Wildman's essay is the only one that engages with this material.

Overall, the papers are, for the most part, highly readable and assume very little background knowledge on the part of the reader. Key terms are explained, in their historical context when necessary, and needless abstracta and technicalia are kept to a minimum. Alternatively, although few of the papers are ground-breaking, there are great papers from Klaas Kraay, John Allan Knight, Nagasawa, Jeffery Long, Rhoda, Palmquist, Edwin Curley, and Lee Hardy. My personal favorite was Hardy's thorough thrashing of the claim that Hume was an atheist or an agnostic; that myth can finally be put to rest. Hardy's work alone was worth the price of the book (wait, the book costs $279, I take it back; it's worth the price of some book).

In the movie, Amadeus, the Emperor criticized a piece by Mozart. When pressed by Mozart to identify the flaw, he, relying on the advice of a counselor, declaimed, "Too many notes, too many notes." The ear, the Emperor thinks, can only hear so many notes. I'm afraid that's my criticism of this book: too many notes (the mind can process only so many models).