Modes of Existence: Papers in Ontology and Philosophical Logic

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Andrea Bottani and Richard Davies (eds.), Modes of Existence: Papers in Ontology and Philosophical Logic, Ontos, 2006, 237pp., $99.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793120.

Reviewed by Berit Brogaard, University of Missouri


Andrea Bottani and Richard Davies' Modes of Existence is an impressive collection of essays on a topic that has been of interest to philosophers for thousands of years, viz. existence.  The volume is exceptional in its coverage.  It touches on several issues only rarely discussed in the mainstream literature, including such issues as the meaning of empty terms in relative clauses, the ontological status of fictitious entities, the identity of fictitious entities across fictions, and the intersubstitutability of terms in fictional contexts.  The only drawback: as the majority of the essays in the volume deal with questions pertaining to fiction, a number of themes relating to the question of existence are underrepresented.  Just one essay (Frederick Kroon's) explicitly addresses the question of whether 'exist' is a first-level or second-level predicate, just one essay (Peter van Inwagen's) deals explicitly with the meaning of our quantifiers, and none of the essays concern the question of whether the quantifiers of ordinary language are objectual or substitutional, or that of whether one can legitimately infer within the scope of a fictional operator that 'a exists' and 'something is F' from 'a is F'.  Nonetheless the essays included are certainly worthy of note.

Kevin Mulligan opens the volume with his paper "Facts, Formal Objects and Ontology".  This is perhaps the only essay in the volume that is not directly concerned with either existence or ontological commitment.  Nonetheless, as Bottani and Davies point out in their helpful introduction (p. 11), the question of the ontological status of facts relates via Wittgenstein to the issue of what there is.  In the Tractatus Wittgenstein declares that 'die Welt ist alles, was der Fall ist' -- the world is all that is the case (or as more popular translations have it: 'the world is the totality of facts').[1]  For Wittgenstein, for something to exist is for it to be the case (or be a fact).  Against the Wittgensteinian thesis Mulligan argues that substances, states, processes and kinds are more fundamental than facts.  The reason for this is that facts cannot serve as truth-makers.  The fact that Mary exists does not make it true that Mary exists.  Mary herself makes it true that Mary exists, which is to say that the fact ontology supervenes on the thing ontology.

In "Fictional and Aesthetic Objects: Meinong's Point of View", Venanzio Raspa discusses Meinong's theory of objects.  For Meinong, every mental state must have an object as a component.  So, if I imagine a unicorn, then there is an intentional object that is the object of my imagination, viz. a unicorn.  Since unicorns do not exist, a non-existent object is the object of my imagination.  So, mental states can have as their objects non-existent entities.  Meinong thought it was impossible for thinkers to have thoughts concerning an object if the object did not have being.  So, for Meinong, non-existent things, in spite of being non-existent, have being: they subsist.

Contrary to what some thinkers have argued (e.g., Bertrand Russell), Meinong did not think that there are impossible entities such as round squares or married bachelors.  Round squares and married bachelors neither exist, nor subsist.  But existing things (e.g., horses, reindeer and Mont Blanc) and possible but non-existent things (e.g., unicorns, flying reindeer and the Golden Mountain) have being: the former are concrete and exist, the latter are abstract and subsist.  In spite of being outside of being, we are in a position to talk about impossible entities.  Hence, for Meinong, impossible entities belong to the given.

In "Russell's Descriptions and Meinong's Assumptions", Frederick Kroon employs Meinong's early theory of assumption to solve a problem for Russell's treatment of negative existentials.  In "On Denoting" Russell familiarly argued that 'the king of France doesn't exist' is to be understood as 'it is not the case that there is just one king of France', and not as the inconsistent 'there exists just one king of France, and he doesn't exist'.  As Russell treated names as disguised descriptions, the problem of empty names could, in his opinion, be solved in the same way.  However, Kroon thinks that sentences of the following sort pose a problem for Russell:

(1) The golden mountain -- you know, the elusive mountain described in Smith's book on famous journeys of exploration -- doesn't exist.

The problem is, as Kroon puts it, that 'the relative clause containing the second description identifies the entity that is presented by the first description' (p. 85).  It might be thought that Russell could just paraphrase (1) as follows:

(2) There does not exist a unique object that is at once uniquely a golden mountain and uniquely an elusive mountain described in Smith's book on famous journeys of exploration.

But this won't do.  For if Smith hasn't written any books, then (1) is false but (2) is true.  Kroon suggests that Russell ought to have been more sympathetic to Meinong's theory of assumption.  We are in a position to pretend or assume that golden mountains or fictional entities exist.  According to Meinong, we can assume that there is a golden mountain in order to deny that it exists.  'Doesn't exist' is, as Kroon puts it, 'to be understood from outside of the pretense, where [it is] correctly applied to a certain non-existent object, the golden mountain, that is also identified (again, outside the pretense) as the elusive mountain written about by Smith'.  According to Kroon, this is what is going on in the following discourse fragment (p. 100):

(3) You know the large hotel in the distance that you have been pointing out to me?  I am pretty sure it is not a hotel at all -- sadly (given my accommodation needs), it looks as if it is just a trick of the light.

The description 'the large hotel in the distance that you have been pointing out to me' is being introduced within the scope of the pretense, and its non-existence is asserted from outside of the scope of the pretense.  However, this analysis of negative existentials calls for something of a sacrifice, on Russell's part.  For it requires a treatment of 'exist' as a first-level rather than a second-level predicate.  But, as Kroon points out, this is a small sacrifice to make in order to be able to preserve the 'robust sense of reality' favored by Russell.

The primary goal of Peter van Inwagen's essay "McGinn on Existence" is to defend the thesis that 'there is' means 'there exists' against Colin McGinn's theory that a distinction should be drawn between these two expressions.  Van Inwagen thinks McGinn's neo-Meinongian theory is unique in the following three respects: (1) there are non-existent things, and they are man-made -- they are introduced when people tell stories, (ii) non-existent things are necessarily non-existent, for example, because Holmes was brought into existence by a particular mental act that does not occur in other possible worlds, Holmes could not possibly have existed, and (iii) there are things that exist but which do not actually exist, viz. possibilia which do not depend on anyone's mental acts (e.g., McGinn's younger sister).

Van Inwagen is primarily interested in the neo-Meinongian claim that there are things which do not exist.  In order to describe the dispute between himself and the neo-Meinongian without getting into a fight over the meaning of 'there is' and the $ quantifier, van Inwagen introduces the symbol '"' to express 'absolutely unrestricted universal quantification' -- its standard meaning (p. 119).  As unicorns do not exist, Van Inwagen holds that

(R) ∀x~x is a unicorn

For all x, it is not the case that x is a unicorn.  The neo-Meinongian denies this:

(M) ~x~x is a unicorn

Van Inwagen notes that one cannot refute the neo-Meinongian by pointing out that one cannot find unicorns among the inventory of the world, for neo-Meinongians do not claim that unicorns are things one can "find"; non-existent objects occupy non-existent places and non-existent times, and no time machine or worm hole transporter can take us to such "places".

Van Inwagen thinks (R) follows from straightforward considerations of what 'non-existence' means.  For him 'every unicorn is non-existent' simply means 'every unicorn is such that everything is not it', yielding (R).  So, it must be that the neo-Meinongian doesn't mean what van Inwagen means by 'non-existence'.  Van Inwagen confesses that he doesn't know what the neo-Meinongian means.

As the neo-Meinongian denies that 'exist' is definable in terms of 'all' and 'not', the neo-Meinongian is committed to two kinds of universal quantifiers.  As van Inwagen puts it:

Since the neo-Meionongian believes that 'exists' has a meaning that cannot be explained in terms of unrestricted universal quantification and negation, he therefore believes in two kinds of quantification, where I believe in one.  I have two quantifiers: '∀' and '~~'.  (Call these the unrestricted quantifiers.)  Of course, I don't usually write the second one that way, and I usually call it something that starts with 'e' and rhymes with 'residential'. (p. 122)

The neo-Meinongian has two unrestricted quantifiers (just like van Inwagen) and two restricted quantifiers, which may be defined as:

AxFx = dfx(x exists → Fx)

ExFx = df  ~x~(x exists & Fx)

However, van Inwagen points out that defining the two restricted quantifiers in this way does not shed light on what the neo-Meinongian means by 'exist'.  He thinks they do in fact mean 'not-all-not' by 'exist', even if they deny that this is so.

Achille Varzi begins his essay "The Talk I Was Supposed to Give" with the observation that we often speak of negative events.  For example, we might say 'Beth saw Al not leave' and 'Al doesn't often go jogging'.  But, says Varzi, this is very strange, for taken at face value, negative events are events not performed; hence, they are entities which do not exist.  However, Varzi thinks the appearance that talk of events commits us to non-existent entities is an illusion.  If Beth saw Al not leave, then what she saw was a positive event, for instance, Al's drinking a glass of wine, Al's smoking a cigarette, or Al's watching television (p. 133).  There are various ways we can describe an object.  We may describe Susan as 'the student who flunked logic', 'the student wearing a red shirt', 'my high school sweetheart', and so on.  Events too can be described in numerous ways.  For example, Al's watching television can be described positively as 'Al's watching television', 'Al's watching the news', 'Al's looking at the screen', and so on.  But it can also be described negatively.  If Al was supposed to leave, we might describe his watching television as 'Al's non-leaving', or more colloquially 'Al's not leaving'.

Varzi admits that some might say that Al's not leaving and Al's watching the news are distinct events, because they seem to have distinct properties.  For example, Al's not leaving may be what caused Beth's anger, whereas Al's watching the news didn't cause Beth's anger.  So, by Leibniz's law, Al's not leaving is not identical to Al's watching the news.  But Varzi denies that there are several distinct events here.  There is just one event and several descriptions.  Not every description will be appropriate in every situation.  Which description is appropriate will depend on what is salient in the context.  So, if it is salient that Al was supposed to leave, then it is more natural to describe what Al did as 'Al's not leaving' than as, say, 'Al's watching the news'.  Varzi suggests that 'Beth saw Al not leave' has the following underlying form:

e(non-leaving (e, Al) & saw (Beth, e))

'Beth saw Al watch television' is of the form:

e(watching television (e, Al) & saw (Beth, e))

But, says Varzi, e doesn't 'pick out two distinct events in the two cases.  It picks out the same event under two different descriptions, and which description is more appropriate is a pragmatic question' (p. 136).

After showing how the view can be extended to deal with causal reports, Varzi considers an important objection to his view (p. 142).  Consider:

(4) Al's failure to turn off the gas caused an explosion.

If Al didn't try to turn off the gas, there may not be a good candidate for being a positive event (or cause).  Varzi replies that it is not at all clear that reports like (4) are indeed causal reports.  In fact, Varzi thinks (4) should be read as:

(5) There was an explosion because Al didn't turn off the gas.

(5) is a causal explanation.  A causal explanation need not cite a cause; it only needs to say that something that was supposed to occur but didn't could have prevented some event.  According to Varzi, (5) is what we mean when we utter (4).  (5) is literally true, but (4) is not, as 'Al's failure to turn off the gas' has a null-extension.  So, on Varzi's view, the event language employed in ordinary language is devious.  As a further illustration, consider (p. 149):

(6) Al tried not to call Sue.

Varzi thinks (6) has the following underlying form:

(7) Al strove that ~∃(calling (e, Sue) & agent (e, Al))

As (7) says that Al strove that it is not the case that there is a calling of Sue by Al, (7) does not commit us to negative entities.

In "Two Interpretations of 'According to a Story'" Maria E. Reicher deals with the problem of accounting for fiction-external statements such as (p. 157):

(8) Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology.

Fictional statements are commonly dealt with by assuming that the relevant statement is embedded within the scope of an implicit story operator, for example, 'according to a story'.  But if we embed (8) within a story operator, we get a falsehood, not a truth, viz. 'according to a story, Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology'.  The latter is false, if there is no story in which Pegasus is a character from Greek mythology (and even if there is one, there might not have been).  Another example (p. 158):

(9) Miss Marple has been impersonated by Margaret Rutherford.

(9) seems true, but 'according to a story, Miss Marple has been impersonated by Margaret Rutherford' is false.  Reicher thinks these sorts of considerations suggest that 'there is no satisfactory way to avoid the ontological commitment to [abstract] fictitious entities' (p. 159).  Fictitious entities are part of ordinary discourse, literary criticism and can even be protected by copyright regulations (p. 160).

Reicher does not consider the possibility that (8) just means 'according to Greek mythology, Pegasus exists' and that (9) just means 'Margaret Rutherford has pretended to be Miss Marple'.  Given a non-Kripkean account of names (see below), that would make (8) and (9) ontologically innocent.[2]  However, let us set that objection aside.  As Reicher notes, if fictional entities are abstract, a problem remains.  When we say 'Pegasus is a flying horse', we are not saying of an abstract object that it is a horse.  No abstract object is a member of the set of horses or the set of flying horses (as that set is empty).  To solve this problem Reicher suggests that story operators are ambiguous (p. 170).  They can occur either as sentential operators or as predicate modifiers.  'Pegasus is a flying horse' is to be understood as 'Pegasus is, according to a story, a flying horse'.  As an abstract object referred to by 'Pegasus' is portrayed as a flying horse, according to a certain story, it is true that Pegasus is, according to a story, a flying horse.

In "Madame Bovary as a Higher-Order Object" Carola Barbero argues that fictional objects are kinds of structural objects, or what she calls 'higher-order objects'.  Her view is motivated by the observation that the properties of fictional objects are not limited to the properties explicitly mentioned by the creator of the fiction in which the fictional objects are characters.  For example, 'Madame Bovary is a naïve and stupid woman' is true, even if Flaubert never says this.  A fictional entity is thus something over and above the set of properties actually ascribed to it by the author.  Barbero takes fictional entities to be collections of internal and external properties.  Internal properties are properties a fictional object has, according to the fictions in which it is a character.  For example, Madame Bovary has the internal property of being a concrete woman.  But outside of the fiction it is false that Bovary is a woman; she is in fact an abstract object.  So, she has the external property of being abstract.  But Madame Bovary is not a simple collection of properties.  For Madame Bovary can occur in several different literary works (p. 177).  According to Barbero, this is possible because a fictional object 'rigidly depends on its structure, and only generically on its properties and on the relations subsisting among them, in the same way as a melody depends rigidly on its shape and generically on its pitch, on its notes and on its intervals' (p. 181) It is because fictional objects have structures that they can appear as characters in several distinct works.  Madame Bovary occurs in Allen's "The Kugelmass Episode' and in Flaubert's novel.  According to Barbero, Allen's character and Flaubert's character are one and the same iff they have the same structure.

In "Identity Across Time and Stories" Francesco Orilia continues the discussion of how to identify fictional entities across time and stories.  For example, what makes the following sentence true?

(10) The Achaean who devised the trick with the Trojan horse, according to the Odyssey, is the Achaean who guided the expedition past the Pillars of Hercules, according to Dante's Inferno.

After considering and rejecting endurantist and perdurantist accounts of persistence of characters across fictions, Orilia suggests that sequentialism has a better chance at being true.  Sequentialism can be traced back to Roderick Chisholm, who argued that an object cannot gain or lose a part without ceasing to exist.  On Chisholm's view, objects do not endure or perdure.  Instead they are sequences of three-dimensional objects which are related to each other, because we have, as Orilia puts it, 'conventionally chosen some … reidentification criterion' (p. 204).  Orilia thinks there are many different equally legitimate and conventionally chosen reidentification criteria.  Fictional entities, he says, are lists of properties some of which have been chosen as the conventional essence.  Whether or not (10) is true will thus depend on which properties we have conventionally chosen as the conventional essence of the two fictional characters.  (10) is true iff there is a conventional essence shared by the Achaean who devised the trick with the Trojan horse in the Odyssey and the Achaean who guided the expedition past the Pillars of Hercules in Dante's Inferno.

In "A Problem about Reference in Fiction" Giuseppe Spolaore addresses the problem of reference in fiction.  The problem is that many fictions contain names of real entities (e.g., 'New York', 'George W. Bush', or 'World War II').  According to the principle of semantic innocence, a name has the same meaning in any linguistic context.  So, if 'George W. Bush' refers (directly) to Bush in extensional contexts, it also refers (directly) to Bush in fictional contexts.  The problem is that the principle of semantic innocence seems to clash with another compelling principle, viz. the principle that 'if in a work of fiction reference is made to a real individual, that individual is a character of the work of fiction' (p. 221).  To see why the two principles are inconsistent, suppose (with Spolaore) that someone wrote a story, Two Planets, in which Hesperus and Phosphorus are two distinct planets.  According to the principle of semantic innocence, 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' both refer to Venus.  So, Hesperus and Phosphorus are the same character in Two Planets.  But intuitively, they are not.  For Two Planets says that Hesperus and Phosphorus are distinct.  Spolaore thinks that the solution to this problem is to draw a bright distinction between semantic facts and 'the semantic properties one has to ascribe to the story to assume -- or pretend, or make believe -- that it is true' (p. 236).  'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' refer to Venus, regardless of whether they occur in extensional or fictional contexts.  But unlike a factual report or a documentary, a fiction merely asks us to pretend that its content is true.

I turn now to my criticism.  Since detailed criticism of each of the essays in Modes of Existence is not feasible given the nature of this note, I shall focus on a theme common to several of the volume's essays (in particular, Varzi, Reicher, Orilia, and Spolaore), viz. the issue of intersubstitutability of co-referring names in non-extensional contexts.  As mentioned above, Spolaore attempts to solve the problem of intersubstitutability of terms in fictional contexts by drawing a distinction between semantic facts and what fictions ask us to do.  Unfortunately, drawing this sort of distinction does not get to the heart of the problem.  For a difficulty remains, viz. that of accounting for the fact that the following sorts of sentences may differ in truth-value:

(11) According to Two Planets, Hesperus is not identical to Phosphorus.

(12) According to Two Planets, Hesperus is identical to Hesperus.

If 'Hesperus' and 'Phosphorus' were intersubstitutable, then according to Two Planets, Hesperus would and wouldn't be identical to Hesperus.  But in the envisaged scenario, it is not the case that according to Two Planets, Hesperus is not identical to Hesperus.  It may be suggested that this problem goes away on the assumption that 'according to Two Planets' is a hyperintensional operator.  But to say that the story operator is hyperintensional is just to say that co-referring terms need not refer to their actual referents within the scope of the operator.  For this reason, hypothesizing that the story operator is hyperintensional does nothing to solve the problem.  In fact, if the principle of semantic innocence is true, that is, if terms have the same meaning in every linguistic context, and the meaning of a term is its referent, then hyperintensionality should not be possible.

The same sort of problem arises if we take the meaning of abstract terms (e.g., numerals) to be their referents.  For suppose numbers are sets.  In particular, suppose 2 is identical to the set }. And suppose I write a story, Two, in which the following is true. 2 is identical to the set { {}, }, 2 is identical to 2, it is not the case that 2 is identical to }, and it is not the case that 2 is not identical to 2. The following sentences are then true: (13) According to Two, 2 is not identical to }.

(14) According to Two, 2 is identical to 2.

However, if '2' and '}' are inter-substitutable, then according to Two, 2 is not identical to 2, contrary to what we stipulated.

Taking fictions to be non-deductively closed sets of propositions, as suggested by Orilia (p. 210) will not safeguard against this problem.  For if fictions are non-deductively closed sets of propositions, then the proposition that 2 is not identical to } is a member of my story Two. Yet if the content of '2' is }, then the proposition that 2 is not identical to } just is the proposition that 2 is not identical to 2.  But according to my story Two, 2 is identical to 2, and it is not the case that 2 is not identical to 2.

The same sorts of problems arise for sentences embedded in 'seeing' contexts.  Recall that Varzi proposes to avoid commitment to negative events by taking event-denoting expressions to be descriptions.  'Beth saw Al not leave', for example, has the following underlying form:

(15) ∃e(non-leaving (e, Al) & saw (Beth, e))

(15) says that there is some e such that e is a non-leaving by Al, and Beth saw e.  Varzi's analysis has much to recommend it, but I do have one worry about it.  Consider:

(16) Lois Lane saw Superman land on the roof.

(17) Lois Lane saw Clark Kent land on the roof

On Varzi's view, (16) and (17) have the following underlying forms:

(18) ∃e(landing on roof (e, Superman) & saw (Lane, e))

(19) ∃e(landing on roof (e, Clark Kent) & saw (Lane, e))

Says Varzi: a landing on the roof by Superman just is a landing on the roof by Clark Kent.  As Lane saw this event, (16) is true iff (17) is true.  But, given what we know about Lois Lane, (16) may be true, while (17) is false.  For it is arguable that (16) entails that Lois Lane knows that Superman landed on the roof, whereas (17) entails that Lois Lane knows that Clark Kent landed on the roof.  But (in some contexts at least) it isn't true that Lois Lane knows that Clark Kent landed on the roof.  It follows that (in some contexts at least) it isn't true that Lois Lane saw Clark Kent land on the roof.

In the face of these problems, it may be suggested that (16) and (17) have the following underlying forms:

(20) ∃e(Lane saw that e was a landing on the roof by Superman)

(21) ∃e(Lane saw that e was a landing on the roof by Clark Kent)

This sort of analysis of 'seeing-event' reports is in fact independently motivated, as it allows for a somewhat uniform treatment of 'seeing-event' reports and seeing-wh reports.  Consider:

(22) Lane saw what Superman did at 3 p.m.

(22) is of the form (Brogaard forthcoming a and forthcoming b):

(23) ∃e(Lane saw that e is what Superman did at 3 p.m.)

where 'what Superman did at 3 p.m.' is a predicate which denotes the set of (salient) entities Superman performed at 3 p.m.  If the set of salient entities Superman performed at 3 p.m. is the singleton set containing a landing on the roof by Superman, (22) is true iff Lane saw that e is a landing on the roof by Superman.

As (20) and (21) make clear, co-referring terms are not intersubstitutable in 'seeing that' contexts.  It may be suggested that this lack of intersubstitutability can be explained on the assumption that seeing is seeing under certain guises.  For example, it may be thought that the proposition expressed by the embedded clauses in (20) and (21) is true relative to the Superman guise but false relative to the Clark Kent guise.  But while this suggestion might solve the problem which 'seeing-that' reports present for traditional semantics, it does nothing to solve the problem posed by fictional contexts.  For example, it makes no sense to say that (13) [= 'According to Two, 2 is not identical to }'] is true relative to a certain guise but false relative to another.  To solve the general problem posed by non-standard intensional contexts, we must reject the assumption that the meaning of a term is its referent.

Fregean accounts of meaning entail a rejection of the assumption that the meaning of a term is its referent.  Frege's original account familiarly runs into trouble (see Kripke 1980).  But contemporary Fregean approaches such as David Chalmers' (1996, 2002, 2006, manuscript) two-dimensional approach sidestep these problems.  On the two-dimensional approach, expressions have two layers of meaning (which may coincide): a primary intension and a secondary intension.  Secondary intensions are akin to intensions, as traditionally construed, and primary intensions are akin to Fregean senses.  For Chalmers, a belief report of the form 's believes p' is true iff s has a belief with the Russellian content of 'p', in the mouth of the ascriber, and a structured primary intension that is relevantly connected to the primary intension of 'p', in the mouth of the ascriber.  If we assume that the content of perceptual states are propositional in nature,[3] we can extend the two-dimensional approach to account for 'seeing-event' reports as follows (see also Chalmers 2004): (17) [= 'Lois Lane saw Clark Kent land on the roof'] is true iff for some salient event e, Lois Lane has a perceptual state with the Russellian content of 'e is a landing on the roof by Clark Kent' that picks out the denotation of 'a landing on the roof by Clark Kent' under an appropriate 1-intension.  As Lane does not have a perceptual state that picks out the denotation of 'a landing on the roof by Clark Kent' under an appropriate 1-intension, as we envisage the case, (17) is false.

The two-dimensional framework also explains why 'Twin Oscar saw his brother drink some water' is false if uttered by an Earthling.  As the watery stuff in Twin Oscar and his brother's environment is XYZ rather than H2O, there is no e such that Twin Oscar has a perceptual state with the Russellian content of 'e is a drinking of some water by Twin Oscar's brother', as uttered by an Earthling.  So, Twin Oscar did not see his brother drink some water.

The two-dimensional approach can be extrapolated to account for sentences in fictional contexts as follows.  Let us say that 'according to story S, p' is true iff 'S', plus relevant background information, weakly a priori implies 'p'.[4]  Since 'Hesperus is not Phosphorus' does not weakly a priori imply 'Hesperus is not Hesperus', it may be true that according to Two Planets, Hesperus is not Phosphorus, even if it is not true that according to Two Planets, Hesperus is not Hesperus.  Two-dimensionalism has traditionally taken logical and mathematical truths to be a priori implied by any sentence.  But even if 2 is identical to the set }, it is quite plausible that '2 is not }' does not weakly a priori imply '2 is }', in which case it may be true that according to Two, 2 is not }, even if it is not true that according to Two, 2 is }.  In sum: the fact that Fregean accounts of meaning sidestep the problems of substitutability whereas Kripke-style semantics does not suggests that we should reject Kripke-style semantics in favor of a Fregean account.

In conclusion, Modes of Existence is primarily about fictional discourse and fictitious entities and only secondarily about existence.  Nonetheless, as it is rare to find in leading periodicals and typical philosophy books any rewarding discussion of fictional discourse and fictitious entities, Modes of Existence is an uplifting and thought-provoking supplement to the usual menu of middle-of-the-road publications.


Brogaard, B. forthcoming a. "What Mary Did Yesterday: Reflections on Knowledge-wh", Philosophy and Phenomenological Research.

Brogaard, B. forthcoming b. "Why Concealed Questions aren't Concealed Questions: Reflections on Knowledge-The and -A", in Franck Lihoreau, ed., Knowledge and Questions, special issue of Grazer Philosophische Studien.

Chalmers, D. 1996. The Conscious Mind: In Search of a Fundamental Theory, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, D. 2002. "On Sense and Intension", Philosophical Perspectives 16: 135-82.

Chalmers, D. 2004. "The Representational Character of Experience", in B. Leiter, ed., The Future for Philosophy, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, D. 2006. "The Foundations of Two-Dimensional Semantics", in M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia, ed., Two-Dimensional Semantics: Foundations and Applications. Oxford University Press: 55-139.

Chalmers, D. 2006. Manuscript. Propositions and Attitude Ascriptions: A Fregean Account.

Frege. G. 1892. "On Sense and Reference", in P.T. Geach and M. Black, ed. Translations from the Philosophical Writings of Gottlob Frege, Oxford: Basil Blackwell, 1952, 56-78.

Kripke, S. 1980. Naming and Necessity, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Williamson, T. 2000. Knowledge and its Limits, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] Wittgenstein goes on to say that the world is the totality of facts, not things (1.1).

[2] Sentences such as 'The detective who lives on Baker Street in the Conan Doyle stories is the detective who meets Freud in The 7% Solution' present a greater challenge.

[3] This is the position sometimes called 'intentionalism' or 'representationalism'.  Note that it is open to representationalists to adopt a version of disjunctivism.  On this approach, both veridical and non-veridical states (e.g. seing vs. appearance) would have propositional content but they would be different kinds of states.  See Williamson (2000: intro) for this approach to knowledge vs. belief mental states.

[4] I have in mind a notion of apriority closely related to Chalmers' notion but weaker in the sense that logical and mathematical truths are not a priori.  Thus, even assuming that classical logic is true, 'intuitionistic logic is true' does not weakly a priori entail 'excluded middle is true'.  The relevant background information clause is required in order to account for not-explicitly-mentioned fictional truths such as 'Sherlock Holmes has a kidney'.