Monads, Composition, and Force: Ariadnean Threads through Leibniz's Labyrinth

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Richard T. W. Arthur, Monads, Composition, and Force: Ariadnean Threads through Leibniz's Labyrinth, Oxford University Press, 2018, 329pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812869.

Reviewed by Ursula Goldenbaum, Emory University


With this book, Richard Arthur provides a thoroughgoing investigation of Leibniz's metaphysics, aiming to rule out the prevailing phenomenalistic reading of Leibniz and thereby Leibniz's idealism. He is confident that he can provide convincing new arguments by starting from the continuum problem and tracing Leibniz's solutions to that problem at different periods. While he admits that there are clear statements of Leibniz about the phenomenal character of bodies, motion, and derivative forces, he finds it "hard to see why their composition would be a problem", if the idealist reading were correct -- a reading which for him is a view of bodies as "merely intentional objects of the perceptual states of monads". (5) We would "lose the connection that Leibniz stresses between bodies as the actual parts of matter and the discreteness of aggregates of reals." I will come back to this concept of phenomenalism at the end of this review.

Arthur divides the chapters in accordance with several questions that he considers as Ariadnean threads. The first chapter sets the stage by raising Russell's problem of how bodies can be composed from immaterial monads. After an interesting historical survey of misinterpretations of Leibniz -- namely physical monadologies from Wolff to Euler -- he introduces the reader into the more recent English-speaking literature about Russell's "conundrum". In doing so, he tries to bring more clarity to Leibniz's peculiar use of the terms "actual", "ideal", "real", and "phenomenal", where bodies can rightly be called actual while yet considered as phenomenal. He rounds the chapter out with an interesting discussion of the development of these concepts from Leibniz's youth.

Chapter 2 is dedicated to the very question of how bodies can be aggregates of substances. Referring to a letter from Leibniz to Arnauld, Arthur provides "his" solution and states: "what is truly one being" is "the animated substance to which the matter belongs" (11). But corporeal substances are not "unifying matter into a whole at a given time", i.e. synchronically, but rather diachronically, i.e., that which is "providing a thread through the various material manifestations of the [corporeal] substance through time" (11). On this basis, Arthur argues for a stronger spatial understanding of monads contained in matter since bodies are "spatially divided into actual parts" with each "containing monads" (12). Embracing Rutherford's interpretation that monads are in bodies insofar as they are required for the body to be (i.e. they are "presupposed"), he does not see this as sufficient to make sense of Leibniz's talk about monads as being in bodies. To avoid referring to monads as parts, Arthur calls them constituents of bodies. Every body is divided into other bodies, each being either an organic body or an aggregate. The concept of aggregation is considered as the complement to presupposition. Arthur emphasizes that derivative forces, as they manifest themselves in motion that actually divides bodies, are modifications of the primary forces of the monad. This manifesting of primary forces in derivative forces and then again in motion becomes a major formula throughout the book to secure the presence of primary forces -- and thus substances and reality -- in bodies.

In the third, historically very informative chapter, we are introduced to the early modern atomism Leibniz was familiar with since his student days in Leipzig, in order to answer the question, "why atoms feature so prominently in Leibniz's early writings when indivisibility is precluded by actually infinite division" (12). Leibniz indeed kept talking about atoms throughout his Paris period, long after he abandoned infinitely small material quantities. Arthur answers the question by referring to the rich alchemical and medical traditions of atomism, where atoms were not treated as indivisibles. Referring especially to the Wittenberg anatomist Daniel Sennert, and to Julius Caesar Scaliger, Arthur emphasizes that Leibniz's "atoms are only physically indivisible -- they maintain their integrity in the face of physical collisions and chemical reactions -- but are nevertheless divided within by the motions of their constituent parts: inside they are heterogenous and teeming with activity." (13)

Chapter 4 continues this discussion, aiming to answer the question, "why does Leibniz abandon his physical atoms of 1676 for a natural philosophy in which 'every body is animate' or at least a collection of such animate bodies?" (13) Asking the reader to indulge his exploration of the inspiring intellectual milieu of the time, he focuses on Gassendi's criticism of Descartes, on theological issues concerning time, and on Robert Boyle's doctrine of matter as incessantly active. Arthur sees Leibniz as siding with the "pluralist" view of subordinate substantial forms, where each form is related to its own body which is an aggregate of other bodies, without there being a separate hierarchy among monads. He sees Leibniz's replacement of non-indivisible atoms by living substances in the late 1670s as prepared for by these discussions and thus not as a drastic change.

In chapter 5, Arthur takes the bull by the horns. He traces Leibniz's views on motion and forces, beginning with his adoption of "Hobbes's conatus-based natural philosophy," followed by his rejection of indivisibles and his arrival at the infinitely small as fictional -- eventually discovering force in 1678/9. Arthur interprets this last discovery as Leibniz's securing the reality of bodies that are no longer mere phenomena but a manifestation of force. With Leibniz's re-interpretation of substantial forms as forces, Arthur states, he was able to re-establish the continuity between the ever-changing states of each individual monad. There are, in Arthur's account, some challenging formulations that I find disputable. According to him, Leibniz holds that the body must possess a power of constantly producing effects. About "primitive active power," and "primitive passive power" (16), he states: "The primitive active and passive powers in a body are aggregates of those powers in their constituent substances, each of which is constituted by its primitive active and passive force" (my emphasis). Recall that "in", is not taken as if the substances compose the body. Still I doubt that Leibniz could ever think of primitive powers, i.e. substances, as aggregates, and, to the best of my knowledge, there is no textual evidence for this. Also, we can often read about forces without learning whether it is about primitive or derivative forces. Notwithstanding, this chapter provides the reader with a thoroughgoing and challenging discussion of Leibniz's discovery of force and its meaning for his metaphysics and dynamics.

Chapter 6 raises the problem how, if being a substance means being active, primitive passive force could be substantial at all? "Matter on this reading, would be a pure phenomenon" (219), and "we would be thrown back into idealism, where all that exists are immaterial substances." (17) Arthur explains passive power as the limited receptivity of a substance due to God's creation. To him, this limited receptivity is due to the constraints of created substances, which "are always constrained by the actions of the other created substances". And it is this constraint that "manifests itself in each substance as a passive force." (17; see also 222) But: did Leibniz not take great care to exclude such mutual interaction of substances? Did he not always explain such wording as a mere concession to our common speech, just as we still speak about the sunrise in spite of Copernicus?[1]

Since derivative forces are usually seen in the phenomenal realm, Arthur emphasizes in turn that they, as manifestations of primitive forces in bodies' motion, are phenomenal in the Platonic sense, i.e. in their constant change in contrast to the enduring nature of substances. To secure, however, the reality of derivative forces, Arthur argues: "The latter [derivative forces] are real in that they rely on the former [primary forces]." (17) But does not depending on them mean less reality? Arthur tries to circumvent such a hierarchical dependence by focusing on the correspondence between the different levels of reality. Whenever bodies are in motion, it is due to derivative forces that are manifestations of primitive forces (220). He goes so far as to attribute to Leibniz a parallelism: "metaphysical actions are manifested phenomenally as physical actions, each reflecting the other. What is happening metaphysically is reflected in what happens physically, rather than the physical being only an appearance of the metaphysical." (227) The chapter also includes a discussion of Leibniz's exchange with Des Bosses about substantial bonds -- a concept which, Arthur argues convincingly, contradicts Leibniz's "standard view".

The seventh chapter aims to answer the question of how the discreteness of actual things fits with the continuity principle. Leibniz had to find a path between occasionalism, where God owns all actions of single things, and deism, where God's activity is reduced to the beginning, allowing created beings to act completely on their own. It is here that Arthur discusses perceptions of substances. He takes an unusual approach, stating a parallelism of derivative forces in bodies and derivative forces in souls. "Psychically, the derivative force manifests itself as the desires and aversions that we experience in ourselves; physically, derivative force manifests itself as the dead or living forces of which we also have experience". (288) On this basis, he also parallels perceptions with mathematical continua because perceptions can be divided into smaller ones into infinity just as geometrical lines. He explains:

Thus monadic series are precisely as continuous as is any curve in nature. The curve consists in a physical continuum of arbitrarily small rectilinear, uniform motions that are divided in turn by others without limit; a monadic series of perceptions consists in successive finite perceptions, each apparently uniform, although divided within by changes of which the perceiver is unaware. (289)

I am not aware that Leibniz ever uttered a statement that could support such an interpretation. Rather, each perception is infinite, mirroring the universe confusedly, and that is how perceptions allow for memory and even prophecy, namely due to their endurance and overlap. Sure enough, this part of Arthur's book does not provide the textual evidence otherwise provided throughout the book.

While it should be clear at this point that I was not convinced of the main thesis of Arthur's against phenomenalism and idealism, still I am deeply impressed with his serious and knowledgeable work, with its focus on Leibniz's dynamics. I would like to add, though, that I perfectly agree with his rebuttal of phenomenalism iff phenomenalism is understood in Berkeley's sense: that nothing exists without our perceiving it (290). Leibniz's view, though, does allow for things to be independent of us. This objectivity -- or, for that matter, reality -- is granted in God, and above all in the intellect of God. Since rational substances have (limited) access to divine knowledge, they have also the capacity to learn about it and to understand the substantial foundation of phenomena by reason. With this non-Berkeleyan phenomenalism, to me Leibniz remains an idealist still, and primitive active forces are, after all, immaterial.[2] I think he even aimed for idealism but he can grant the objectivity of science in God's intellect and the regularity of phenomena by pre-established harmony. I do not, however, see this as a parallelism, although it shares some features with it. And when Arthur concludes that Leibniz is unique among contemporary mechanical philosophers in stating such a parallelism (290), one wonders why Spinoza plays such a little role in the book -- Spinoza, who ranks as the paradigmatic parallelist in the history of philosophy.

Leibniz scholars are well aware of the complicated textual situation, often with apparently contradictory formulations of Leibniz, even in the same time-period. Arthur has a substantial textual basis for his discussion and is very thoughtful about Leibniz's intellectual context and theological constraints. The book contains highly interesting historical material for better understanding Leibniz's intellectual development. I learned enormously from it; it seriously challenged my understanding of Leibniz. Arthur's book is clearly a major work in recent Leibniz scholarship, showing the anti-phenomenalist position in its greatest strength.

[1] See e.g. Leibniz's Systeme nouveau de la nature et de la communication des substances (GP VII, 477; Ariew/Garber 145).

[2] From the beginning, Leibniz attributed activity to minds and bodies as receiving motion from minds. See Leibniz's letter to Thomasius in 1669, and his Theoria motus abstracti from 1671 (and some preceding writings). The surprising presence of minds in his early writings on mechanics is usually ignored. See though Philip Beeley (1994), 346-351.