Monotheism and Tolerance: Recovering a Religion of Reason

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Robert Erlewine, Monotheism and Tolerance: Recovering a Religion of Reason, Indiana UP, 2010, 246pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253221568.

Reviewed by Ronald M. Green, Dartmouth College



The great monotheistic traditions — Judaism, Christianity and Islam — commonly assert that their beliefs are essential for personal salvation and social well-being. This leads to the view that those outside the tradition are bereft of moral responsibility, and, as Robert Erlewine says at the outset of this book, it fosters an “agonism toward the Other” (10). Are these traditions thus inevitably prone to violence and repression, as some modern students of religious fundamentalisms believe? Is their adherence to pluralistic democracy merely an opportunistic concession to political reality? Or can they somehow be understood in ways that retain their authoritative and exclusivist claims while still fostering full moral respect for those outside their traditions?

Erlewine believes that genuine tolerance and respect for the other are compatible with the discursive structure of the biblically informed monotheisms. His aim is to present and develop an interpretative tradition that is able to recover these faiths’ deepest resources for religious tolerance. He terms this “the religion of reason trajectory,” and identifies its major modern exponents as Moses Mendelssohn, Immanuel Kant, and Herman Cohen. While arguing for the universal moral significance of the “monotheistic worldview,” each of these thinkers also tries to preserve such ideas as the election of a special community that bears the tradition’s message and serves as an agent of its world-historic mission. In chapters that critically examine each thinker’s contribution, Erlewine traces progress in the development of the religion of reason trajectory, in which the earlier and somewhat flawed efforts by Mendelssohn and Kant give way to Cohen’s richly developed perspective.

All three thinkers wrestle with the dialectic between particularity and universality. “While the mission which has been entrusted to the community by God carries universal significance,” Erlewine observes, “there is by no means an inclusive attitude toward those outside the community” (14). Indeed, since the other lies in error, he or she can be perceived as a threat that must be extirpated. Witness the centuries-long treatment of idolaters, non-believers and heretics by these traditions. In Erlewine’s words, these traditions exhibit a deep tension between “scriptural universalism” with its world dominating claims and “rational” or ethical universalism that would respect the other. How, then, can the idea that God has been revealed to one community cohere with the claim that God’s activity in history has positive meaning for all human beings?

Over the centuries, Judaism, with its exclusivist and “chosen people” narrative, has been the principal object of this criticism. Mendelssohn’s genius is to reverse this. In works like Jerusalem and Phaedon, he describes Christianity, with its emphasis on God’s greatness rather than his goodness and its reliance on access to a divinely mediated grace, as representing the failure of the scripturally universalizing tradition. For Mendelssohn, it is Jews who are the emissaries of reason. They have been entrusted to bear the eternal truths of the “religion of reason” in a world marked by “idolatry, superstition and prejudice.” Their mission is to live a diasporic existence, bearing witness to the truth until the eschatological conclusion of history when the distinction between Jew and gentile disappears. In this mission, Jews are bolstered by their divinely revealed law (Halakhah) and are qualitatively privileged over other communities. But this understanding, with its revelational particularity and its reliance on election rather than cultural egalitarianism, is in tension with Mendelssohn’s universalizing claims. Mendelssohn’s position does not necessarily lead to violent rejection of the other. He argues for the value of religious tolerance on the grounds that even error can contribute to ethical conduct. Nevertheless, Erlewine maintains that Mendelssohn never elucidates any account of how Jewish observance of Halakhah benefits the other. He thus is finally unable to explicate rationally the privileged mission of the Jewish people in ways that break out of scriptural universalism’s reliance on an unfathomable God.

Kant, as a major contributor to the religion of reason trajectory, moves in the opposite direction from Mendelssohn. In Religion within the Limits of Reason Alone and other writings, Kant repudiates scriptural universalism and any reliance on historical revelation as a basis of truth, replacing it with a comprehensive rationalist account of the basis and fulfillment of moral existence. Kant offers this as an exposition of the biblical monotheistic tradition, which, on rational grounds alone, he finds most fully developed in the New Testament and in the life and work of Christ. Judaism, despite its ethical monotheism, is given a subordinate place in the account of reason’s development. With its political and theocratic focus, Judaism for Kant is more a form of government than a religion. Lacking morality’s inward and dispositional component, and with its “mechanical worship,” it is a superstitious and “statutory” form of faith. For Kant, says Erlewine, “Judaism exemplifies everything about elective monotheisms that his project seeks to de-legitimize” (113).

So thoroughgoing is Kant’s rationalistic account that it even embraces an understanding of human sinfulness — his famous discussion of radical human evil — and has room for some of the more morally challenging elements of Christian moral teaching, including a modest role for divine grace in human moral fulfillment. But grace is only a tentative postulate to sustain the morally striving will, and at most reveals itself within our moral insights and exertions. Kant will not accept the primacy of either divine revelation or divine initiatives in our moral efforts. The exercise of rational human autonomy is crucial for all human moral achievement, and there is no place for revelation or faith in historically-mediated promises or deeds. Religion is morally valid only insofar as it supports universally rational moral insights. Kant “not only marginalizes revelation,” says Erlewine, but he “transfigures the notion of election to encompass all human beings regardless of their setting and religious communities” (123f.).

Erlewine in no way evokes Hegel, but his discussion reflects Hegel’s thesis-antithesis-synthesis structure. It is in the writings of Hermann Cohen that Erlewine finds an incorporation of the insights and an overcoming of the tensions within the two preceding figures. Cohen’s work is the dialectical fulfillment, “the third and most successful member of the religion of reason trajectory” (131).

Cohen differs from both Mendelssohn and Kant in “unabashedly embracing the ‘emphatic concept of truth’ inherent in the monotheistic worldview, as well as the notion of the Other who lives in error and thus sin” (151). Unlike Kant, Cohen does not believe that a “religion of reason” has already been discovered. He sees it as the historical task of human beings to close the gap between is and ought. However, he sees the Hebraic and Jewish traditions as fundamental resources for this task. As the title of his major religious writing, Religion of Reason Out of the Sources of Judaism, suggests, Cohen develops universal ethical insights out of biblical, rabbinic, and Jewish medieval philosophical sources rather than making his arguments from a philosophical standpoint. “A reason that is universal in scope” is somehow “able to wrestle its way into the history of the particular people” (144).

Erlewine’s discussion of Cohen’s position brings the reader to the center of a major conceptual problem. “Is it not a contradiction,” he asks, “for a particular people to embody universal humanity and yet remain distinct from all Others?” (153). And does this claim to a unique access to ethical truth not lead to violence against the morally threatening other? Erlewine argues that Cohen deftly resolves these seeming contradictions. He does so first by stressing that a fulfilled humanity remains only an ideal to be accomplished. One community can point to this ideal and serve to draw others to it, but it is not permitted to regard itself as its embodiment. It also follows that violence against the Other is impermissible. Following Kant, Cohen acknowledges the problem of human sinfulness, as symbolized in the religious problem of idolatry. But the awareness of sin exposes universal human frailty, tempers self-righteousness, and rules out oppression of the Other caused by equating the “doer with the deed” (156). Idolatry must be opposed, “but the idolater must not be hated” (157). It remains true, of course, that sin (idolatry) can lead to moral error and violence. In Cohen’s understanding, however, this fact can never authorize repressive counter-violence. Instead, the particular community that points to moral truth bears witness to that truth by taking violence onto itself, and by voluntarily undertaking suffering in the name of truth. Israel’s mission is educative. According to Cohen it is “in suffering for other peoples” that Israel "acquires the right to convert" the Other, with conversion understood as the shared movement of Judaism and other traditions to the fulfilled religion of human reason.

Drawing on Cohen’s work, therefore, Erlewine is able to show that pluralism and respect for the other do not require the biblically inspired monotheisms to relinquish their claims to the truth. There is no need for these traditions to retreat from modernity in the fear that their core claims will be dissolved, nor must those who defend tolerance necessarily oppose the truth claims of these traditions. Once it is properly developed, as in Cohen’s mature writings, the religion of reason trajectory can preserve the basic structure of the monotheistic worldview, with its notions of election and world-historic mission, while supporting the social and political achievements of modernity.

Neither Cohen’s position nor Erlewine’s development of it are free of problems. It is noteworthy, for example, that Cohen has little place in his thinking for Christianity. Cohen finds non-moral or extra-moral motifs in Christianity’s emphasis on faith and its stress on a mythic “Christological release from guilt.” These teachings, he says, render the individual’s salvation a primary concern and undermine the relations among human beings that are appropriate to a religion of moral reason. But Cohen fails to develop the non-violent, suffering-servant teachings of Christianity that deeply parallel those he attributes to Judaism. This tells us that defenders of monotheistic claims, even within the religion of reason trajectory and even in their best moments, do not always escape the parochialism of “chosen people” narratives. Is this an unavoidable problem for such traditions, or is it merely a consequence of centuries of mutual recrimination and misinterpretation?

Erlewine’s neglect of this question and his failure to identify the blind spots in Cohen’s account in no way reduces the value of this outstanding study of a major and often neglected philosophical and theological tradition. In different ways, and with differing degrees of success, the three defenders of the religion of reason whose positions Erlewine so carefully exposits sought to establish a place in modernity for the biblical-inspired monotheisms. With religious violence and claims to exclusive religious truth on the rise, their positions merit renewed attention. Monotheism and Tolerance is a groundbreaking start in that direction.