Moody Minds Distempered: Essays on Melancholy and Depression

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Jennifer Radden, Moody Minds Distempered: Essays on Melancholy and Depression, Oxford UP, 2009, 198pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195338287.

Reviewed by Anthony Hatzimoysis, University of Athens



Philosophers can be a rather gloomy lot, so ruminations on melancholy have not been foreign to them. The question is how one can approach melancholy — or its modern day successor: depression — in a methodologically sound manner, that is, without succumbing to a discussion full of suggestive ambiguities, ineliminable vagueness, and opaque metaphors, which characterizes much of the writing on such notoriously elusive states. Jennifer Radden has, over many years of original research, produced a series of papers that shows us what the rigorous study of melancholy should look like. By bringing together most of those papers in one volume, O.U.P. has done a great service to the multi-disciplinary readership to which Radden’s work is addressed.

The virtues of the volume are several. First, it offers a clear reconstruction of the major shifts in the understanding of affective disorders from late Medieval times to the present. Second, it maps those shifts in the broader terrain of the psychological, medical, artistic, theological and epistemological changes. Such shifts led from the awe or pity that surrounded the uncanny figure of “homo melancholicus” (some times conceived as charismatic, other times as sinful, and occasionally as both), to the administrative categorization of neuro-biological malfunctions that fall under the medical heading of “depression”. Third, it unravels the epistemic threads that link affective disorders with certain conceptions of personal identity, responsibility, rationality and ‘unreason’, gender(-biased) divisions, and a variety of normative distinctions. Last but not least, it indicates not only how melancholic phenomena are being moulded on various theoretical models, but also how the phenomena prove resistant to simplistic generalizations. This resistance has necessitated some reflective readjustment within each theoretical system, be it that of empiricist epistemology, faculty psychology, classical psychoanalysis, modern-day functionalism, reductive physicalism, or unrepentant rationalism.

To be sure, covering such a wide range of issues incurs its own methodological cost. There are several moments when readers may feel their philosophical appetite well excited, but not quite satiated. This is not due to a dearth of relevant data or lack of historical detail (it is quite formidable how much crucial information the author achieves to contain in each chapter). The problem I think lies in the fact that the reader learns a lot about how various schools of thought have analyzed melancholy, but not as much about how — when all it is said and done — we ought to think about it. It might be retorted that the latter is not on the author’s agenda, but I find this hard to believe. Someone who can master such a wealth of opposing intellectual currents, and reconstruct them for the reader’s benefit in such a lucid manner, is very likely motivated by nothing less than disclosing the truth about the matter at hand. Perhaps part of the story related by Radden’s arresting narrative is that we should not think of melancholy (and of melancholia, depression, etc.) as some inert, ahistorical, atemporal entity, waiting patiently for some lucky researcher to stumble upon it. On the contrary, how people have been talking about, taking positions on, and writing about melancholy is an integral aspect of how melancholy and other affective phenomena are identified, reflected upon, or even experienced in the first place. However, the task of historical reconstruction can pave the way for articulating substantive claims about melancholy, as well as for enhancing our understanding of a number of related notions. In what follows we shall look at one of the notions that Radden discusses in a really thorough and incisive manner: pain.

Before I focus on that particular notion, though, let me stress that a quick leafing through the table of contents and the index might give a truncated picture of what the reader will find in the volume. Humean ideas, for instance, are accurately placed in their context, the Hegelian allusions are most apposite, and Kant’s philosophy of mind is clearly and systematically discussed — yet Hume, Hegel, and Kant are not included in the index. Also not in the index are notions of artistic representation and aesthetic appreciation, on which Radden insightfully comments at several points in the text, especially during the discussion of melancholy landscapes.

Turning now to the issue of pain as Radden develops it in chapter 7. She begins by highlighting the presence of serious ambiguities, if not of outright inconsistencies, in the standard — and supposedly neutral — definitions of pain in psychiatric literature. She then convincingly argues that the inadequacies of standard definitions are not mere accidents, but are indicative of the theoretical problems generated by the attempt to overlook the rich phenomenology of pain experience, to overgeneralize on the basis of few, conveniently chosen cases, and to aim for maximal reduction at the expense of the empirically observed differences within the wide range of pain phenomena. Radden next usefully groups those phenomena under two main headings, ‘emotional-pain’ and ‘sensation-pain’, and identifies a set of eight criteria in the light of which we may distinguish instances of each. I would highly recommended reading Chapter 7. It shows the author’s analytical skills in full display, and it distills out of a wealth of interdisciplinary literature what is crucial for a proper understanding of the relevant notions. Finally, it advances in a quite subtle and discreet way the evaluative (arguably moral) imperative of showing due respect, as researchers, to the unique, complex, and all too real experience of emotional pain.

However, I find a certain part of Radden’s discussion misleading. My worry is that her analysis of the so called ‘intentionality’ of pain distorts the experience of bodily pain. ‘Intentionality’ denotes the directedness of a state or activity to be about, to be directed toward, or at, something. As is well known, in recent philosophy of mind, several routes have been tried for bringing sensations under the heading of intentional phenomena. The major motivation for setting pain as an intentional event is that we can offer an ‘intentionalist’ account that takes the representational content of the phenomenon to be exhaustive of its content - and thus to account for sensation-pain with no phenomenal remainders, i.e., with no mysterious non-representational ‘qualia’ left. That issue is clearly distinct from the topic addressed by Radden: whether sensation-pains are directed to things outside oneself, in the world. Radden rightly affirms that sensation-pains differ from emotional-pains in that the former, unlike the latter, ‘do not refer’, ‘are not about’, nor ‘are directed at’ anything in the world. She articulates her position, though, by stating that sensation-pains are ‘minimally intentional’, in the sense that they are ‘over or about themselves’. This is a seriously problematic claim. Taken literally, it means that a sensation is necessarily a reflective state: that a sensation is always a sensation about itself, or that to have a pain is to have a pain about the pain. To see the absurdity of that claim, it suffices to realize that it commits us to the phenomenologically false view that when one’s stomach aches, one necessarily has a stomachache about the stomachache (a headache about the headache, a toothache about the toothache, etc.). One, of course, might have one kind of pain about another kind of pain, as Radden aptly points out in her illuminating example of experiencing emotional-pain about her sensation-pain. As she also notes, however, such an emotional-pain ‘is at most a contingent accompaniment’ of the ‘normal experience of sensation-pain’.

Does the above mean that we should equate emotional and sensation-pain on that score, by thinking that if sensation-pain is not about itself, it should be about things or events in the world? No, a better way to approach this matter is by rethinking what is involved in the claim that the phenomenon of pain is intentional. Consider how we tell the difference between a stomachache and a headache. At a very basic level, the difference lies in the fact that in the former case the pain comes from the stomach, and in the latter from the head. By recasting this in intentional terms, we may say that in the former case our conscious awareness is directed at the stomach area, and in the latter at our head. What is intentional, in other words, is the conscious activity by which a subject experiences a particular area — lying within her (apparent) bodily limits (save cases of phantom limb pains) — in a particular mode, i.e., painfully (cf. Hatzimoysis 2003). A pain, or any other sensation phenomenon, is intentional not because the sensation is about itself. Rather, to have a sensation is to be ‘conscious of’ (and thus, your conscious awareness to be ‘about’, or to be ‘directed towards’) a bodily spot in a certain way.

In this connexion it is worth noting Radden’s proviso that, unlike sensation-pains, emotional-pains are ‘fully and richly intentional’ if they are not ‘objectless’, i.e., only when they are intentional. That, of course, implies that, according to her, emotional-pains (or, indeed, emotional feelings of either positive or negative valence) can be non-intentional. The main pressure against the intentionality of emotion comes from the case of moods, i.e., of affective phenomena characterized by an apparent lack, or at least by a non-specificity, of target. However, as Radden very eloquently explains in connection with Heidegger’s account of Stimmung, that view of moods as objectless, or at best self-involved and inward-looking affections, is far from obvious (cf. Hatzimoysis 2009). Further, in the relevant part of the Introductory chapter to the volume, she concisely presents the main grounds for supporting the view that moods are paradigmatically intentional states, indeed the primordial ways of ‘being attuned to’, or ‘experiencing the world’. Whatever the truth about that matter, my worry is that it was not clear (at least, to me) what Radden’s considered view is on this topic. Are all emotional phenomena intentional or not? If not, is it because moods — contrary to what phenomenologists think — are non-intentional states? As far as melancholy, melancholia and depression are concerned, can we articulate a clear answer to that perplexing question? Perhaps the jury is still out on that issue. It would be important, though, to see how Radden would cast her vote — her purview of the case is among the most authoritative in contemporary literature.


Hatzimoysis, A. (2003) ‘Emotional Feelings and Intentionalism’, in Anthony Hatzimoysis, ed. Philosophy and the Emotions (Cambridge University Press).

Hatzimoysis, A. (2009) ‘Emotions in Heidegger and Sartre’, in Peter Goldie, ed. Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Emotions (Oxford University Press).