Moore and Wittgenstein: Scepticism, Certainty, and Common Sense

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Annalisa Coliva, Moore and Wittgenstein: Scepticism, Certainty, and Common Sense, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 248pp, $85.00 (hbk) ISBN 9780230580633.

Reviewed by John Koethe, The University of Wisconsin-Milwaukee


This book is a useful and sustained examination of a variety of themes in Wittgenstein's On Certainty, the very late compilation of remarks inspired by G.E. Moore's engagement with scepticism and idealism in "A Defence of Common Sense," "Proof of an External World" and a few other papers. Both Moore's and Wittgenstein's views are examined in detail. Among the topics considered are the strategies of Moore's arguments, ordinary and philosophical uses of language, differing interpretations of Moore, externalism, internalism and contextualism, Wittgenstein's objections to Moore, meaning and use, language games, Cartesian and Humean sceptical arguments, the epistemic and semantic status of so-called "hinge" propositions, epistemic relativism, and a comparison of Wittgenstein's and Moore's views with those of subsequent philosophers. There is extensive discussion of much of the secondary literature on Moore and Wittgenstein. The book is a translation from the Italian and I am sorry to say that the translation is often frustrating, with numerous grammatical and stylistic infelicities making it harder to read than it should be. Given the wide range of topics Coliva considers, I shall confine my attention in this review to three that seem to me especially important: the nonsensical (according to Wittgenstein) character of both Moore's adducing of his common sense propositions in an attempt to refute scepticism and idealism, and of the doubts the sceptic raises; Wittgenstein's attempt to respond to Cartesian sceptical arguments; and the status of hinge propositions.

Wittgenstein was dubious about Moore's use of the propositions he deployed against scepticism and idealism, though he found propositions of their general character to be of great interest, but not for Moore's reasons. I shall turn to Wittgenstein's view of those propositions shortly, but what of his qualms about Moore's (and the sceptic's) use of them? According to Coliva, Wittgenstein regarded those uses as nonsensical. This in itself is not new. What is interesting is her account of why he so regarded them. On this account, terms like 'know' and terms expressing doubts are meaningful only when used in tightly circumscribed language games. The rules of these games are so tightly circumscribed that any violation of them renders the terms meaningless, and those rules are so determinate that Moore's and the sceptic's violations of them are clear. Assertions involving 'know' are subject to rules requiring evidence or reasons, and conversational relevance. Moore's claim to know that, say, he has a hand violates these rules. Expressions of doubt are subject to rules requiring practical grounds for doubt, and the possibilities of mistake the sceptic raises violate these rules. These qualms are not peculiar to discourse concerned with philosophical scepticism: on Coliva's account, Wittgenstein held that all philosophical discourse violates the rules of the language games in which the terms it uses are properly employed and so is nonsensical.

How persuasive are these considerations? To me they always recall a remark of Hilary Putnam's: "Philosophy may be a backwater but it's still part of the stream of life." They seem to presuppose a rather extreme version of the view that meaning is somehow determined by use, one which requires that terms can only be meaningfully deployed in the context of tightly circumscribed, semiautonomous language games. Coliva may be right that Wittgenstein entertained such a view in On Certainty (some of his remarks on religion suggest it too). But in the Investigations, the notion of a language game is much more loose and heuristic. It is meant to provide an alternative conception of language to the stringently representational one of the Tractatus (I myself do not think these two conceptions are incompatible) and is not always characterized by precise, articulable rules (any more than games in general are). Coliva does seem to advocate the view of language games she attributes to Wittgenstein, though she concedes that the response to scepticism based on it has not found wide acceptance.

This is an appropriate point to remark briefly on the "therapeutic" tendencies of Wittgenstein's late work, on which Coliva places a great deal of weight (though she does not see the late work as entirely therapeutic). To my mind, the only entirely successful example of philosophical therapy or diagnosis to be found in Wittgenstein is the critique of the Tractatus suggested by the opening parts of the Investigations, in which the baroque intricacies of the completed picture theory of propositions are traced to a small number of initially captivating assumptions or principles (the pictorial character of language and thought, logical form, determinacy of sense) which are ultimately seen to be baseless. But Wittgenstein had a rather blinkered view of philosophy, and it seems to me he too quickly assumed that all attempts at systematic philosophizing could also be shown to be delusional in the way the Tractatus was.

In any case, there is a more interesting reason why the approach to scepticism Coliva attributes (perhaps correctly) to Wittgenstein seems problematic. She discusses the work of Thompson Clarke and Barry Stroud, but mostly in connection with an attempt to link the distinction between ordinary and philosophical discourse to contextualism. But Clarke's most important insight (at least according to the oral tradition -- he has published very little), one that also informs the work of Stroud and Stanley Cavell, concerns the continuity between the use of 'know' in discussions of scepticism and in ordinary, nonphilosophical contexts. In particular, we ordinarily require makers of knowledge claims to be able to rule out counterpossibilities to what they claim to know, a requirement that follows from the principle that knowledge is closed under known logical consequence. Yet this requirement is what lies behind Cartesian sceptical arguments like the dream argument. So if the demand that Moore's and the sceptic's use of 'know' be governed by the same rules that govern its ordinary use is an appropriate one, it is arguable that it can be met -- at least unless we can deny or plausibly restrict the closure principle, which no one has been able to do in a way that commands widespread acceptance.

Wittgenstein found Moore's attempts to refute sceptical arguments unconvincing, though he found the common sense propositions Moore deploys in the course of it extremely interesting (Moore's attempt at a direct refutation of what Coliva calls Cartesian scepticism occurs in "Four Forms of Scepticism"). Nevertheless, Coliva does see Wittgenstein as offering a response to Cartesian scepticism, which she identifies with the argument from dreaming: if I know that I have a hand, then I know that I am not now dreaming; I do not know that I am not now dreaming; therefore I do not know that I have a hand. The response is based on an idea first introduced in the Investigations and later elaborated by Norman Malcolm in his book Dreaming, to the effect that while dreaming one can neither make assertions nor entertain thoughts or beliefs.1

I think Wittgenstein's idea is intriguing, but its effectiveness as a response to Cartesian scepticism seems to me questionable. For one thing, the crucial premise of the argument from dreaming is that I do not now know that I am not now dreaming, and it nowhere requires me to assert or think that I am. Now either I am now dreaming or I am not. If I am not, then while I may think that I am not, I arguably do not now know that I am not, since I seem unable to give a satisfactory answer to the question of how I know this. On the other hand, if I am now dreaming, I do not now know that I am not either, since not only is it not true that I am not, I do not now even believe that I am not. In either case I do not now know that I am not now dreaming.

The other problem is that Wittgenstein's idea, to the extent that it is correct, may be based on the peculiar experiential character of dreaming. It is not at all clear that it can be extended to other Cartesian-style sceptical arguments like the demon argument or its contemporary brain in a vat and Matrix variants (Coliva somewhat misrepresents the demon argument by suggesting that what the demon is supposed to do is cause us to have deceptive dreams, rather than directly inculcating deceptive thoughts, sensations and ideas in us). Putnam has tried to argue, based on a casual theory of reference, not that a brain in a vat could not have any thoughts, but rather that the contents of its thoughts could not be what are needed to make Cartesian sceptical arguments work.2 But most philosophers have not found his arguments convincing.

Let me turn finally to the role and status of the propositions resembling Moore's that Wittgenstein found so interesting, which have come to be called hinge propositions. I think it need not be assumed that they coincide exactly with Moore's (Coliva makes needlessly heavy going over propositions like 'No one has ever been to the moon' and 'The earth has existed for a very long time,' which have been falsified on the one hand or disputed by Biblical literalists on the other). Most agree that Wittgenstein thinks that while they may have the form of empirical propositions, we have not actually investigated them and cannot give adequate reasons for accepting them. Rather, the attitude we adopt towards them in practice (e.g., taking them for granted, though Coliva resists this way of putting it) allows us to teach and learn language games and language in general and engage in activities of epistemic inquiry in particular. For example, if a pupil is constantly raising doubts about the existence of the objects involved in ostensive teaching, that teaching will not be efficacious. Unless we assume our laboratory instruments are real, we cannot even begin to rely on them to draw conclusions about empirical matters.

Coliva considers in some detail Crispin Wright's (and to a lesser extent Michael Williams') suggestion that by virtue of playing the role they do in our acquisition of language and concepts and in our epistemic practices, these hinge propositions acquire a kind of nonevidential warrant and are justified and even known in the absence of specific grounds or reasons. I think she is quite right to reject this view, for, whatever its merits, it is certainly not Wittgenstein's, who constantly emphasizes that our language games and epistemic practices do not rest on any sort of knowledge. Her own view is that the attitude we adopt towards hinge propositions makes them function as "norms" or rules governing the activities they underlie, which is her interpretation of Wittgenstein's suggestion that while they may have the form of empirical propositions, they are not. She considers two versions of this interpretation: what she calls the Kantian version, on which they are norms and at the same time propositions which are either true or false; and her own, on which they are simply norms and are not factual propositions or true or false at all. (This is probably why she resists saying that we take them for granted in practice, which sounds like we are making a factual assumption, and why she worries so much about propositions like 'No one has ever been on the moon' and 'The earth has existed for a very long time.')

What does it mean to say that hinge propositions serve as "norms"? I do not see that Coliva explains this. The closest she comes, it seems to me, is when she suggests that someone's questioning or failing to acknowledge that there is, say, a hand right in front of him shows that his sense organs are not functioning properly or that he is mentally disturbed. It may indeed indicate this, but I do not see how its doing so can be reconciled with her idea that 'There is a hand in front of me' is neither factual nor true or false. After all, for one's sense organs to fail to be functioning properly is (roughly) for them to fail to adequately register the facts about one's immediate environment (and something similar could be said about mental disturbance generally). But if 'There is a hand in front of me' does not report any facts about my environment, then it is hard to see how questioning it could show that my sense organs were not sensitive to them. I suspect that part of the problem is that Coliva is too quick to attribute to Wittgenstein a sweeping antirealism, something I see no reason to do, though this is hardly the place to pursue the matter.3

On Certainty is a fascinating but frustrating compilation, full of false starts, hesitations and changes of mind, which Coliva helpfully disentangles and some of which support her (to my mind) somewhat convoluted and confusing reading of the book. I tend to think that the truth is closer to the surface. Propositions like Moore's are ordinary factual propositions which in practice we just take for granted, even though we have not specifically looked into them (which is not to say that we could not). They do not have an elevated epistemic status and are not really known in any strict sense (so that Wittgenstein was not offering any sort of refutation of scepticism, and his indifference to epistemology persisted to the end). But unless we take some such propositions (they are not fixed) for granted, we could not (given the sort of creatures we are) acquire the abilities and engage in the practices, including epistemic practices, we do. In that sense those abilities and practices rest on our accepting them. And I think that looking at the book in this way has the advantage of being fruitful.

Richard Miller, for instance, has developed a view of theory confirmation that strikes me as inspired by something like this reading of On Certainty, though he does not explicitly say it is.4 Miller emphasizes the role of what he calls "topic-specific truisms" (e.g., "middle-sized objects usually have the approximate shapes and colors which eyesight reveals to normal people seeing them in moderate sunlight, close-up") which have not themselves been the objects of scientific inquiry but are accepted by all parties to scientific disputes. He goes on to show how the acceptance of such truisms plays a role in the resolution of actual scientific disputes, such as the nineteenth-century dispute between realists and instrumentalists about molecular theory. Whether or not this proposal actually owes anything to On Certainty, it at least suggests that the book, like almost all of Wittgenstein's writings, remains a source of insights, many undeveloped, well worth pursuing.

1 Norman Malcolm, Dreaming (London: Routledge & Kegan Paul, 1959).

2 Hilary Putnam, Reason, Truth and History (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981).

3 For a discussion of Wittgenstein and realism, see my The Continuity of Wittgenstein's Thought (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 1996). For more on my own view of Moore, Wittgenstein and scepticism, see my Scepticism, Knowledge, and Forms of Reasoning (Ithaca, NY: Cornell University Press, 2005).

4 Richard Miller, Fact and Method (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1987).