Moral Character: An Empirical Theory

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Christian B. Miller, Moral Character: An Empirical Theory, Oxford University Press, 2013, 346pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199674350.


Reviewed by Bradford Cokelet, University of Miami


Contrary to what its title might suggest, Christian Miller's book does not propose a comprehensive empirical account of good moral character and how we can cultivate it. Instead, it defends a surprising and somewhat depressing thesis about most people's actual character; namely, that few ordinary people have virtues such as compassion and honesty. Miller does not contend, however, that you and your friends are most likely riddled with vices such as cruelty or dishonesty. Rather, his core claim is that most people's character is neither good enough for virtue nor bad enough for vice and that for this reason we should say that most people have 'mixed traits' of a sort that go unrecognized in common sense thought and talk. Roughly put, people with mixed traits will only sometimes perform the actions that the virtuous would and, even when they do, they will often be motivated or influenced by various less than virtuous psychological factors (self-interest, lingering guilt over a past mistake, being in a good mood, etc).

If Miller is right, mixed traits can best explain the experimental results that some other philosophers take to cast doubt on the existence of robust character traits and to support the "situationist" view that irregularities in human behavior are best explained by variations in environmental factors, not psychological traits. So although Miller does not provide us with a comprehensive empirical account of good moral character, he does give us an account of the (less than stellar) moral character that most people have, and this account posits traits of the sort we would presumably need to start from when thinking about how to cultivate the virtues.

In what follows, I will focus on questions about if and how the empirical work Miller impressively surveys really grounds his two core contentions: (1) that few ordinary people are compassionate, honest, cruel, or dishonest, and (2) that the ordinary type of moral character is made up of mixed traits.

1. Ascription Conditions for Virtues and Vices

To mount his case for the rarity of honesty, compassion, cruelty and dishonesty, Miller lays out some minimal conditions that one must meet to have those virtues and vices and then argues on empirical grounds that most people fall short of those conditions. In the interest of space, I will focus on his most fully developed discussion, which centers on the virtue of compassion.

As mentioned earlier, Miller contends that ordinary people only sometimes perform the actions that the virtuous would and, even when they do, they will often be motivated or influenced by various less than virtuous psychological factors (self-interest, lingering guilt over a past mistake, being in a good mood, etc.). But he also wants to allow that some such deviation from perfect virtue is compatible with one's having a specific virtue trait, such as compassion, so his minimal conditions are set up to show that the types of deviation suggested by the empirical evidence ground the claim that ordinary people lack the virtue of compassion. My first, predictable, worry is that his minimal conditions for having compassion are misguided.

To assess Miller's view, we should consider the three main types of condition that he stipulates: behaviors, enhancers and inhibitors, and motivations. To my mind, Miller's motivational conditions are extremely plausible. In short, he holds that a compassionate person should characteristically help out of altruistic desires rather than, for example, selfish ones (e.g., to look and feel good, or, say, to curry favor with those one helps). Perhaps more contentiously, he also holds that a compassionate person is motivated by altruistic desire rather than a sense of moral duty, but I will grant that.

Things become more problematic when we turn to Miller's behavioral conditions and his position on inhibitors and enhancers. Here he holds (i) that a compassionate person can be counted on to help others when doing so is moderate to easy and (ii) that her propensity to help will not be affected by the presence or absence of factors such as lingering guilt over a past mistake, being in a good mood, or being embarrassed. To get a sense of the types of helping behavior Miller has in mind, consider a representative sample from the experiments he discusses: warning a stranger that her shopping bag has a hole in it and that candy is falling out, helping a stranger pick up dropped papers, volunteering to participate in a study a graduate student is running or for a charity, delivering notes for someone running an experiment when it is supposedly over, and mailing a letter some stranger dropped. Now my worry about these kinds of cases is that, although we would expect an ideally compassionate person to help in these ways, and it would be surprising to find that many people will only do so when it is in their self-interest, performing such actions out of altruistic desires is not a plausible minimal condition on compassion.

To see the problem here, consider Maria, who tirelessly works to run and support a homeless shelter and who spends countless hours comforting and counseling homeless people. She does so because she cares about the people she serves and she was moved to pursue this career when she read about the plight of the homeless in her city and it broke her heart. When not at work, Maria is a devoted and loving mother of two adopted boys. She often invites other kids over to play; she knows their parents have to work on the weekends to make ends meet, and she feels bad for them. I submit that Maria is a compassionate person. Moreover, I would continue to maintain that she has the trait of compassion even if it turns out that she does not help random strangers in the various ways on which the empirical studies focus. More generally, I believe that if someone's main commitments, projects, and relationships in life are shaped by altruistic desires to help others, then she exhibits compassionate character even if she is, for example, disinclined to help random strangers in (mostly) minor need.

Of course the average person's job (choice and performance) is not shaped by compassion in the way Maria's is, but I think that even when we turn to people whose lives are less fully informed by characteristic altruistic desires, there is a response Miller should worry about. Consider Maria's sister, Raquel. She works in the post office delivering mail, and her job is not informed in any deep way by altruism. Still, she is a loving mother and partner, volunteers at Maria's shelter every other weekend, and is the caring person friends and family turn to when they need support or advice. Now if she, like Maria, is disinclined to help out strangers, should we say she lacks the trait of compassion? I am not sure, but one option would be to divide up the trait of compassion into various relationship or project specific traits. We might hesitate to say that Raquel is a compassionate person because doing so implies she has a trait that permeates her projects and relationships, and, instead, describe her as a compassionate mother, sister, and friend. In any case, I have trouble seeing why we should think she is completely bereft of compassion.

Last but not least, I want to mention a type of minimal condition that seems plausible and that Miller does not introduce: the emotional disposition to feel bad (or at least not good) about the suffering of others and, perhaps, about one's not helping them when one could. For example, if Raquel doesn't feel bad for the grad student who gets no volunteers for his experiment and actually takes pleasure in his plight, then that would provide evidence against her having the virtue of compassion. More generally, although I doubt that not helping strangers in relatively easy and costless ways establishes that one lacks compassion, I suspect that being disposed to perverse (or just cold?) reactions to the suffering others endure might well do so. A hard case would be one in which Maria, the altruistic social worker, mom, and friend goes in for a crass Marxist ideology and is then chillingly unmoved (but not pleased) by the misfortunes that her wealthy neighbors endure. Perhaps here, again, we should resist thinking she is a compassionate person but still say she is a compassionate social worker, mom, and friend, but I am not sure, especially when reflecting on analogous cases involving racism.

2. The Scope and Import of the Empirical Evidence

Having raised some questions about the ascription conditions Miller proposes for the virtue of compassion, I want to now turn to the empirical literature he surveys. This part of the book is impressive and shows that psychologists are clever at devising studies to test hypotheses about the motives that drive helping behavior. In particular, when psychologists discover strange variations in people's helping behavior, they then go deeper and try to settle what sorts of motives explain the variation. For example people who have been made to feel guilty at the start of an experiment are more likely to help a random stranger later on, but that does not settle what motive or psychological process proximally explains the increased helping. Is it a desire to repair the past wrong? A desire to repair wrong-doing in general? A selfish desire to no longer feel guilty? Or, less problematically, does feeling guilty trigger some independent cognitive state or process (e.g., paying more attention to what one is doing and how it will affect others) that then explains the increased likelihood of helping?

In general, Miller thinks the empirical research supports the claim that most people's helping behavior is augmented and dampened by various factors that trigger morally suspect or neutral motivations. His key contention is that there are common variations in people's dispositions to help random strangers in relatively easy ways and that these variations are driven by factors other than an altruistic desire to help.

Now Miller recognizes that the empirical input to his argument is subject to change, but he insists that his argument is well supported by his survey of the large extant psychological literature on helping. I am willing to believe that he has surveyed the relevant extant literature but want to raise two worries about whether the literature he presents warrants his confidence in his conclusion. First, Miller's summary of the empirical work on helping suggests that psychologists have not adequately tested what we might call non-debunking accounts of the relevant variations in helping behavior. These would be accounts that allow that the agents who help are indeed motivated by altruistic desires. Take my suggestion that guilt might trigger some cognitive process such as increased attention to what one is doing and how it is affecting others. This increased attention could then allow for an altruistic desire to arise and explain the helping behavior. This seems like a plausible phenomenological claim about some cases to me. But while Miller mentions psychologists who have (only recently) developed an analogous hypothesis (called 'the concomitance model') to provide a non-debunking account of why positive moods or affects often increase helping, it seems no one has considered this approach to explaining why guilt often increases helping. So until psychologists do more to rule out non-debunking explanations of increased helping, I think we should be wary of accepting Miller's depressing conclusion.

But now suppose I am wrong about this and, as Miller thinks, common variations in people's dispositions to help random strangers in relatively easy and costless ways are driven by factors other than an altruistic desire to help. I still don't think this will support the conclusion that most people lack the trait of compassion (or some bounded version of it). I did earlier grant Miller's motivational condition on compassion -- that compassion requires that one help out of an altruistic desire -- but, as the discussion of Maria and Raquel suggests, I also think we need to think about the scope or domain of the relevant help and its role in a person's overall way of life. Specifically, I want to report my utter surprise that the helping literature Miller surveys focuses so single-mindedly on people's behavior when interacting with strangers and its dominant focus on relatively easy and costless actions. Of course an ideally compassionate person would act with appropriate motivation in these cases, but I am left thinking that the evidence about people's motivations would establish what Miller wants only if it covered domains that are more central to people's lives, i.e., the way they interact in substantive relationships and in the way they adopt and pursue life defining projects. For example, if there was evidence that people comfort and help their children a lot more when they are made to feel guilty about something else and that their increased concern for their children was motivated by a desire to stop feeling guilt, that would seriously threaten the assumption that many people are compassionate parents. And if such results generalized to other domains in which our character is most centrally manifest, I would accept Miller's depressing conclusion. If my impression of the literature from Miller's book is right, however, psychologists are simply not studying helping in the domains that are of central importance (for assessing the kind of character ordinary people have).

3. Relationship and Project Virtues with Mixed Traits at the Margins?

In conclusion, I want to sum up the less depressing picture of ordinary character that I think fits the empirical evidence that Miller presents in his book and that he needs to attack in order to defend his view. My thought is that a substantial number of people have relationship- or project-related virtue traits, such as the one we refer to when we call someone a compassionate parent and friend, and that there are also a good number of people (like Maria) who we can call compassionate people because their altruistic desires explain why they have and how they inhabit their central life projects and relationships. What the experimental studies may show is that most people nonetheless are not compassionate to strangers and that how and when they help strangers is largely explained by morally suspect or neutral psychological factors of the sort that Miller highlights. We could sum this up by saying that there are compassionate people and people with bounded compassion traits, but that most people are not ideally compassionate, because they are not compassionate to strangers. If this is right, we might hope that virtue will result if people work to extend the scope of their existing traits of compassion and if they critically examine the social and psychological forces that encourage us to adopt different personas in private, professional, and public domains. I think this is more or less the model that various religious traditions presuppose, so it might be interesting to look at the practices for character cultivation they commend in this context.

Finally, let me emphasize that anyone interested in the intersection of empirical psychology and ethics will profit from reading Miller's book, and that all fans of virtue ethics should turn to it and the second book Miller has just published to get up to speed on the current state of debate. Even if my doubts about Miller's overall thesis (i.e. that few ordinary people are compassionate, courageous, cruel, etc) are sound, his proposal that mixed traits can account for the experimental data to which trait skeptics appeal may well stand, and it certainly constitutes a substantive and appealing new move in the debate about how virtuous people are to strangers.


I would like to thank Laura Papish, Anita Kelly, and Christian Miller for feedback on this review.