Moral Conscience through the Ages: Fifth Century BCE to the Present

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Richard Sorabji, Moral Conscience through the Ages: Fifth Century BCE to the Present, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 265pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226182728.

Reviewed by Stephen Darwall, Yale University


In this fascinating and magisterial study, Richard Sorabji both demonstrates and describes the intense interest philosophers have had in the ethically central phenomenon of conscience ever since the ancients. The book's appearance is much to be welcomed, especially since the topic has been relatively absent from recent ethical philosophy and moral psychology.[1] Readers will find here both excellent history of philosophy and, it may be hoped, a stimulus to contemporary thought.

According to Sorabji, the Greek term for conscience, 'suneidêsis', "began to appear with some of its eventual meaning" in Greek playwrights of the fifth century BCE. Its original meaning illustrates much of the concept's complexity: "sharing knowledge with oneself, of a defect, almost always a moral one of being in the wrong" (2). This Greek idiom "went over easily into Latin" as conscientia. "One can say in Latin that a person is sharing knowledge with himself. The con- in the noun conscientia is simply a translation of the Greek sun- (shared with) and the scientia is a translation of Greek eidêsis (knowledge)" (14).

This already brings out the duplicity or dividedness of mind, and the element of second-personal address, that is central to conscience. (Sharing something with someone implicitly involves address, even if the person is oneself.) Typically, when we talk about freedom of conscience or "prisoners of conscience," we tend to identify a person's conscience with her moral convictions. But this flattens conscience as a psychic phenomenon. We don't normally think of convictions, even moral ones, as having a "voice," but we naturally think of conscience this way. And I will suggest that part of the reason freedom of conscience matters so much to us is deeply connected to this feature.

Sorabji notes that the defects that are the objects of suneidêsis's self-shared knowledge are "almost always . . . moral." But not always. Plato, he points out, often has intellectual faults, such as forms of ignorance, in mind (18). However, almost always the Greeks reserve 'suneidêsis' for the moral fault of "being in the wrong." This is a narrower use of 'moral' than we find in Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, where 'moral' contrasts with 'intellectual' to mean virtues and vices that are concerned with character, actions, and passions. It is a deontic use, such that one is in the wrong when one has done wrong, for example, by wronging someone (which Aristotle treats under the vice of injustice). The earliest examples of suneidêsis Sorabji discusses are Euripides's Orestes, who has self-knowledge of murder, and Jason, who has it of his infidelity to Medea, both apparently deontic uses. Awareness of deontic fault -- not just of some fault in one, but its being one's fault, being at fault -- is clearly the sense of 'conscience' that has come down to us through the ages. I am painfully aware of my faulty trombone playing, but not through conscience.

To experience suneidêsis, moreover, it is not enough that someone, say, Orestes, simply be aware of his own wrongdoing. He must have an experience that makes him aware of it, that confronts him with it. One natural way this can occur is through the feeling of guilt. Guilt is a deontic emotion in the sense that it responds to one's apparent wrongdoing; it presents one's (past) action to one as having been wrong. Guilt can also function prospectively. Considering doing something, guilt feelings may intrude the thought: "but that would be wrong."

Sorabji briefly discusses the familiar thesis that ancient Greek culture was a shame rather than a guilt culture (17). This is related to the thought that Greek ethical philosophy was primarily aretaic or "kalonic" (from 'kalon' (noble or fine)) rather than deontic.[2] Unlike guilt, shame responds distinctively not to wrongdoing, but to apparent imperfections (or "unpresentable" features). Though he notes these differences between shame and guilt, Sorabji says that shame cannot be "separated off from guilt" in such examples from the Greek dramatists as those just mentioned. This is no doubt correct. It would be surprising if the emotions of guilt and shame were not both playing important and somewhat complementary roles in ancient Greek life and drama. That said, it seems clearly the case that Greek ethical philosophy, certainly that of Plato and Aristotle, is more fundamentally aretaic or kalonic than deontic.[3]

Sorabji also says that although Greek thinkers may not themselves distinguish guilt from shame (there are eighteen occurrences of 'shame' in Ross's translation of the Nicomachean Ethics but none of 'guilt'), "the situations which provoke shame in the Greek portrayals in some cases provoke also the attitude which we distinguish as guilt." This also seems right. Nevertheless, it is an important fact that guilt and deontic categories play, at best, a secondary role in ancient Greek ethical philosophy, if not in Greek life or drama, and that these are the categories to which conscience must respond if it is to consist in self-shared knowledge of being in the wrong.

Similarly, Sorabji distinguishes suneidêsis from Socrates's idea of a daimon or "guardian spirit" (21). Plato does describe the daemon as having a kind of voice, one that only opposes Socrates's unwise intentions, but never proposes. But though this is obviously closely related to conscience, it lacks conscience's distinctive tie to being "in the wrong."

Sorabji notes a fascinating difference between Epicurus and the Stoics on conscience that has reverberations in early modern disagreements between neo-Epicureans, like Hobbes and Locke, and neo-Stoics, like Shaftesbury, Butler, Smith, Rousseau, and Kant (23-33, see also chapters 7 and 8). Epicureans and neo-Epicureans recognize no other motives than desires for the good, which they identify with pleasure. For them, therefore, conscience must ultimately reduce to fear of sanctions, whether worldly or eternal. We see forms of this in Hobbes and Locke, no less than in Epicurus.

Stoics and neo-Stoics, on the other hand, insist on a capacity for self-reflective self-regulation, the Stoic hegemonikon or Butler's "principle of reflection" or "conscience," through which human beings can be autonomous. And they recognize a natural law of right and wrong that can bind and motivate independently of sanctions. (It should also be said, however, that ancient Stoics were eudaimonists who tended to see the right as a kind of intrinsic good rather than as something that makes an independent normative claim on action.)[4]

Neo-Stoics of the early modern period, like Bishop Butler, also drew inspiration from the role of conscience in Christian thought and, especially, from the writings of St. Paul. Sorabji has an insightful discussion of the subtleties of the Pauline account, which show themselves in a famous passage from Paul's Epistle to the Romans that was frequently quoted in the early modern period in support of a doctrine of natural conscience.

When Gentiles who have not the law do by nature what the law requires, they are a law to themselves, even though they do not have the law. They show that what the law requires is written in their hearts, while their conscience also bears witness and their conflicting thoughts accuse or perhaps excuse them on that day when, according to my gospel, God judges the secrets of men by Christ Jesus. (31)

It was the first part of this passage that was frequently quoted in the early modern period to show that ordinary human beings are subject to, and so accountable for complying with, the moral law, since they can know it independently of any revelation or received doctrine. Butler, for example, quoted it in his Sermons when he argued that it is because we have a "principle of reflection" or conscience that human beings are a "law to themselves." Sorabji points out, however, that what Paul himself says about conscience and its function is actually somewhat different. As Sorabji analyzes it, conscience is not (primarily, anyway) for Paul, as it would be for Butler, the source of our knowledge of the moral law, the law "written in [our] hearts," nor is it the voice (or "the candle") of God within us. It is rather a kind of "co-witness" that "bears witness" to God and the judged when "their conflicting thoughts accuse or perhaps excuse them on that day" (the Day of Judgment).

Note that Paul says that through the judged's conscience, "their thoughts accuse" (emphasis added). This means that even if conscience has a kind of "witnessing voice" in a proceeding in which the accused is being judged, conscience is nonetheless ultimately still the accused person's own voice. Similarly, even for thinkers, like Butler, who hold that conscience is the voice of God within, it is nonetheless true that we cannot be a law to ourselves, we cannot really hold ourselves accountable, unless conscience's voice is also our voice. Here again we see the duplicity of mind that the very idea of conscience involves. The voice of conscience is not the kind of external voice that schizophrenics are afflicted with.[5] When we are condemned by our own conscience, we are, as early modern British rationalists like Cudworth, Clarke, and Price, put it, "self-condemned."

This is a version of what in The Second-Person Standpoint, I call "Pufendorf's Point."[6] Moral agents can intelligibly be held accountable for complying with the moral law, whether by God (as Pufendorf holds) or by you and me (as representative members of the moral community), only if we all have the capacity to hold ourselves accountable. But this requires precisely that we be able to divide ourselves and take the very same kind of second-personal relation to ourselves that philosophers from the times of the ancient Greeks have associated with conscience. We address ourselves from a common standpoint we share with anyone who is in a position to hold us accountable.

Sorabji describes how, beginning in the twelfth and thirteenth century, a new term, synderesis, was introduced in addition to conscientia (which, again, came from suneidêsis). The concept of synderesis was developed in different ways by a Franciscan tradition deriving from Bonaventure and by the Aristotelian tradition of Albert the Great and Aquinas, respectively. The former takes conscientia to be an intellectual moral apprehension with synderesis supplying conscience's motivational "spark" (61). For the latter, however, synderesis supplies knowledge of general moral principles (natural law) from which conscience derives its more particular judgments.

Sorabji argues that any "division of labor" between intellectual and motivational aspects of conscience is unnecessary since knowledge or belief that an action would be wrong can be motivating in itself (61). Although that seems right, there are nonetheless reasons, to which I shall recur presently, for thinking that conscience includes an intrinsically motivating second-personal attitude toward oneself -- self-blame or guilt -- that differs from the simple belief about oneself that one's conduct was or would be wrong. (Just as the belief that someone would be worthy of blame differs from the attitude of blame itself.)

Sorabji contrasts seventeenth-century critiques of conscience, as he reads them, in Montaigne, Hobbes, and Locke, with eighteenth-century "rehabilitations" of conscience in Butler, Smith, Rousseau, and Kant (128-183). Montaigne sees conscience as the creature of custom, and Hobbes and Locke view it as consisting in motivationally inert "opinion." As neo-Epicureans, they hold that motivating desires can only concern the good, not the right; so ultimately motivation must come from (rational) fear of sanctions.

Butler, Smith, Rousseau, and Kant, on the other hand, inherit the Stoic line. They hold that the capacity for motivating self-reflective moral assessment is intrinsic to moral agency. Butler defends the Stoic position that wrongful conduct violates a "law of our nature," and that our capacity to grasp this self-reflectively is a condition of our moral agency. Smith and Kant make more explicit the way in which conscience involves a divided self, the idea first encountered in the Greek suneidêsis. Thus Smith: "When I endeavour to examine my own conduct, when I endeavour to pass sentence upon it, and either to approve or condemn it . . . I divide myself as it were into two persons."[7] Kant also uses the metaphor of the "doubled self," but he actually describes the phenomenology as have three personae: accused, prosecutor, and judge.[8]

Although he doesn't make Sorabji's pantheon, it is worth mentioning a seventeenth-century figure who fits much better with this latter Stoic-influenced group than with neo-Epicureans like Hobbes and Locke: the Cambridge Platonist, Ralph Cudworth. Here is an illustrative passage from Cudworth's Treatise of Freewill:

The same sense of nature's instincts appears yet more plainly, from men's blaming, accusing, and condemning themselves for their own actions, when done . . . against the dictate of honesty. Men have an inward sense of guilt (besides shame), remorse of conscience.[9]

Eighteenth-century British rationalists, Samuel Clarke and Richard Price, picked up the idea that conscience involves "self-condemnation". Here is Clarke:

For whoever acts contrary to this sense and conscience of his own mind, is necessarily self-condemned.[10]

What Clarke and Price mean by "self-condemnation" is the same as what Cudworth calls "remorse of conscience," or we are likelier to call "guilt" or blaming oneself. These are examples of what P. F. Strawson called "reactive attitudes."[11] Although Sorabji says that "belief or knowledge" of the moral character of one's actions is sufficient for moral motivation and that conscience need have no distinctively motivational aspect, it seems clear that conscience involves these distinctive (reactive) attitudes. Belief that one is blameworthy, again, is a different attitude than blame (for oneself) itself.

In the last thirty years, a number of philosophers, including Gary Watson, R. Jay Wallace, and myself, have followed Strawson in arguing that reactive attitudes, like blame, have features that distinguish them from beliefs about oneself and one's actions, even concerning their blameworthiness. Blame, guilt, self-condemnation, "remorse of conscience," are all implicitly second personal in the sense that they implicitly address demands to their objects and hold them accountable. It seems impossible to account for conscience fully without bringing in this second-personal element. Sorabji's analysis of suneidêsis as sharing knowledge with oneself of wrongdoing shows that a second-personal element was essential to views of conscience from at least the Fifth Century BCE. What is clearer now after twenty-five centuries of ethical thought is that conscience involves, not just sharing knowledge with oneself, but also holding oneself accountable.

In focusing this review on the history of views of conscience, I have had to leave out a wealth of fascinating material that Sorabji includes on the history of religious and political thought concerning conscience, for example, on freedom of conscience and religion. These take up almost half the book and span early Christian writers to contemporary figures like Gandhi. There are lots of interesting insights. Most of us are familiar, for example, with Locke's argument for religious toleration that religious belief cannot be coerced. But Sorabji notes that Augustine had argued that although force cannot produce religious belief directly, it can support it indirectly in all kinds of subtle ways, thus anticipating an objection that would be made to Locke by Jonas Proast in the seventeenth century (49-50).

There is also a very interesting discussion of Martin Luther's critique of the "terrorization of conscience." Partly what Luther had in mind were Roman Catholic practices of selling indulgences through which sins could be absolved (and the terrors of eternal punishment avoided). But Luther was also critical of the idea of deontically required "works" more generally. As Sorabji puts Luther's idea: "law merely terrorizes the conscience" (111). Better to admit our helplessness and have faith in God's mercy.

There is, of course, a more recent and secular version of the "terrorization" critique, one that runs through Nietzsche, Bernard Williams, and Annette Baier. Talk of "self-condemnation" can encourage the thought that focusing on conscience and deontic morality risks something closer to sadomasochism than humane living. I believe this is a mistake, though I think it is important not to confuse holding people accountable with harming them or to conflate taking responsibility for one's actions with self-flagellation.

Conscience, I believe, is the capacity we presuppose when we hold others accountable, that all moral agents, they, and we, have to hold ourselves accountable. If we hold a belief as a matter of conscience, this means not just that the belief is ours, but that it is a belief we hold ourselves to. That is why freedom of conscience is so precious to us. It is not just a freedom of belief, or a freedom of action. It is rather a freedom that is central to our very moral constitution, as Butler put it, as beings who are capable of taking responsibility for the moral character of our lives.

[1] A notable exception is David Velleman's "The Voice of Conscience," in Self to Self (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2005).  See also Brendan Dill and Stephen Darwall, "Moral Psychology as Accountability," in Moral Psychology and Human Agency, eds., Justin D'Arms and Daniel Jacobson (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2014), pp. 40-83.

[2] This was a central claim of G. E. M. Anscombe's "Modern Moral Philosophy," Philosophy 33 (1958): 1-19.  See also Sidgwick's contrast between ancient and modern ethics in Outlines of the History of Ethics, (Boston: Beacon Press, 1964), p. 198.

[3] I discuss this contrast in "Morality's Distinctiveness," in Morality, Authority, and Law: Essays in Second-Personal Ethics I (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2013), pp. 3-19.

[4] On this, see T. H. Irwin, The Development of Ethics, v. i, (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2007).

[5] Although Velleman points out that Freud thought that the super-ego can take this form in mental illness.  See Velleman, p. 113.

[6] The Second-Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2006).

[7] The Theory of Moral Sentiments, eds. D. D. Raphael and A. L. MacFie.  Indianapolis:  Liberty Classics, 1976), III. i.6.  Referred to by Sorabji on p. 173.

[8] Metaphysics of Morals, 6:438-439.  Discussed by Sorabji on pp. 178-183.

[9] This was unpublished in Cudworth's lifetime.  It is included in A Treatise of Eternal and Immutable Morality, with A Treatise of Freewill, ed., Sarah Hutton (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996), p. 156

[10] L. A. Selby-Bigge, British Moralists, v. ii (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1897), p. 16.

[11] P. F. Strawson, "Freedom and Resentment," in Studies in the Philosophy of Thought and Action (London: Oxford University Press, 1968).