Moral Disquiet and Human Life

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Monique Canto-Sperber, Moral Disquiet and Human Life, Silvia Pavel (tr.), Princeton University Press, 2008, 222pp., $39.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780691127361.

Reviewed by Patricia Marino, University of Waterloo


Moral Disquiet and Human Life is a wide-ranging book with an ambitious goal: to persuade us to rethink the way we conceptualize our ethical and personal lives. Crossing the boundaries between French and Anglo philosophical traditions, Canto-Sperber argues that we all must strive for ethical reflection that is both reasoned and sensitive to the particulars of human experience. The French, Canto-Sperber says, must let go of their refusal to theorize morally, their Kantian obsessions, and their self-satisfied but empty insistence on the importance of "ethics." Anglo-tradition philosophers, she says, must learn to go beyond conceptual analysis and pay closer attention to the way human lives are really lived. And we all must learn that rational, critical reflection about the human good is vitally necessary.

Canto-Sperber's discussion is elegant and stimulating, full of insightful observations and novel conceptualizations. The book is extraordinary in the way it brings together discussion of current philosophical research and ordinary reflection on everyday life. And I am in enthusiastic agreement with most of its central claims. As an intellectual descendent of Mill, I can't help but feel that open debate in public life is better than any alternative. To reflect on the human condition in a way that incorporates both the rigor of logic and analysis and the messy mix of the subjective experience of human life is a wonderful thing but also famously difficult.

At the same time, I found the book frustrating in style and in content. Some of what seemed to me the most important and difficult points are treated quite briefly, and it is sometimes not clear how, exactly, the logic of the arguments is meant to go. At several points, I felt the author moved on to something new just as I was feeling we'd got to the crux of the matter. While there are many interesting short discussions with new and plausible ideas, there's little attempt to show how they fit together overall. In English, the book has a difficult sentence style; how much this is due to the original text and how much to the translation is hard to say, but the translation does have a somewhat non-philosophical feeling to it.[1]

I'll discuss the book as an extended argument for its main conclusions about moral theorizing, human experience, and rational reflection, and I'll raise some difficulties that seem most important to me. By necessity this means leaving some things aside, including some lively critical discussions of French thinkers (Chapters 1 and 3), an original and thoughtful analysis of the limits of moral responsibility (pp. 57-62), and a lengthy section arguing that religious belief does not preclude moral reflection.

The book has two parts, as is reflected in the title.[2] Part One, "Moral Disquiet," focuses on moral philosophy in France. Here, Canto-Sperber first says that moral philosophy in France is lifeless and empty, in part because of misplaced doubts over agency; and second, that moral philosophy is a necessary component of any meaningful system for deciding what to do. Part Two, "Human Life," centers on the role of reflection in our justifications of our own particular actions. Such reflection, she says, must take into account human life as it is lived, with its various constraints, freedoms, miseries, and joys, but must be carried out with a solidly rational methodology. I'll discuss the two parts in turn.

The presentation and diagnosis of the difficulties Canto-Sperber finds in French moral philosophy are fascinating reading for anyone curious about how French and Anglo philosophical traditions have become so different. Criticizing trends in recent French thought that call for "ethics" while denigrating "moral philosophy," Canto-Sperber explains that the latter is looked down on in French public life, because it is conflated with a kind of "moralizing" leading to conformism (p. 6, p. 17). Philosophers compound the problem by incorrectly treating moral philosophy as "futile or unwarranted" (p. 104). Although moral philosophy flourished in France in the early part of the 20th century, Canto-Sperber explains, things fell apart around 1960. The intellectual inheritance of the "death of the subject" was a disaster for French moral philosophy, as it was taken to entail the impossibility of individual agency. Misreadings of Marx and Nietzsche compounded the problem: Marx's emphasis on politics was thought to reduce the "moral" to the "ideological" (p. 109), and readers took to heart Nietzsche's suspicions of morality without heeding his demand that we transcend morality to "discover a new kind of moral life" (p. 107).

Canto-Sperber bemoans this state of affairs, which she argues has contributed to a deep moral malaise in French public life. There, institutional "ethics" committees, working on a misguided idea that democracy can stand in for moral reasoning, ignore the advice of experts and treat everyone's opinions as equally worthy. In place of this, she urges an active alternative founded on argument and reason.

This raises obvious questions about method, justification, and the role of reason in moral judgments. Obviously, debate need not lead to consensus, and, in fact, it doesn't always lead to better outcomes than alternative tactics like protests, strikes and political grandstanding. Notoriously, in real life, people's moral attitudes are often unresponsive to reasoned argument. So why believe in the power of reasoned public moral debate? Canto-Sperber answers not with a pragmatic appeal to the "marketplace of ideas" but with a deeper, stronger claim that debate, reflecting moral reason, yields conclusions that are better, in the sense of being more justified. I'm inclined to agree, but I found the discussion, in chapter two, of moral justification puzzling.

She argues for a view on which justification is not tied to any particular normative theory (such as Kantianism) but is both rational and sensitive to the realities of life. The basic principles of morality (principles such as "respect human beings," "treat everybody fairly regardless of race, religion, nationality, or sex," and so on) are known to all and are unanimously endorsed and valid whether or not they are "true" (p. 55). Reason then makes its own demands: a "critical evaluation mind-set" and "independence of mind" are essential when engaging in ethical reflection (pp. 79-80), and minimal rationality involves duties to "treat similar cases similarly" and not to "inflict unnecessary pain" (p. 72). But fundamentals and reason together do not quite exhaust moral justification, since this can be grounded also in emotional experiences and "strong affective states" (p. 78). Canto-Sperber rejects as false the dilemma of choosing between "axiomatic" (i.e., foundational) and "consistency-driven" (i.e., coherence) approaches to justification, urging instead that we use all available methods in a "dynamic, non-doctrinal" search for the "best" reasons overall (p. 78).

But what is a "best" reason overall? How are we to determine the relative strengths of reasons and the appropriate contexts for using a given method? Indeed, it's hard to see a motivated way to put all the various considerations together. In controversial cases like abortion, cloning, and so on, moral emotions vary greatly from person to person, and it's unclear what the demand for respecting persons comes to. In her brief discussion of abortion, Canto-Sperber says that the legal permissibility of abortion does not entail its moral permissibility (true enough), and on this ground she urges a debate over its moral status informed by moral considerations: that the fetus evolves into a child, that it cannot be seen as an "intruder" into a woman's body, etc. (p. 65). But how is the significance of these considerations to be understood? Canto-Sperber is right to insist that sometimes facts can help justify moral points of view (p. 68), but as this example shows, the question has always been, how? What role would reason play in determining the significance of these facts?

In her discussion of cloning humans, she says that the instinctive response some have about its wrongness is not decisive, because reflection shows that the value involved -- respect for human dignity -- is not undermined by cloning. This raises an immediate question: if simple revulsion is trumped by considerations of rationality, just what role do human emotions play in this account? In any case, the real problem with cloning, Canto-Sperber says, is the transgression of the "negative freedom" of the cloned person: he has been denied the right to an open future because we have determined his genetic identity. No other moral value, she says, can outweigh this negative (p. 77).[3] But, again, on what basis can this power be determined?

These examples illustrate how difficult it is to say what are the proper roles of reason, emotion, and unreasoned intuition in forming moral justifications. I am not claiming that these cannot be put together; indeed, in a sense, they must be put together, and Canto-Sperber is right to insist that they ought to be. But without some discussion of how this can be done, the claim to an account of justification (and hence the grounding for the value of public deliberation) are incomplete, and hence hard to evaluate. If Canto-Sperber's interlocutors are as skeptical as she suggests about the point and value of moral reasoning, they may need more details about just how rational reflection and emotion come together in moral justification in order to be persuaded.

Let me turn now to the second part, "Human Life." Here, Canto-Sperber argues in favor of a general approach to moral justifications and the human good. She starts by refuting the claim that questions about the ultimate meaning of life are somehow pointless or meaningless (Chapter 4). Although such questions do not have propositional or literal answers, life still has meaning, because in our very posing of the question, we consent to engaging in elaboration and justification (p. 138). The answer, she concludes, must be shaped as a search for justifications, and will thus be "closely related to the subject without being subjective" (p. 138). I take this to mean that as long as we have cares and concerns that we rationally reflect on, which we do, life is not meaningless.

When it comes to such reflection, Canto-Sperber endorses a theory of reasons that is "internal" in the sense that reasons for action must be traceable back to our particular desires and beliefs (p. 145). Rational reflection, though, plays two crucial roles: first, we must reflect to learn what our desires and beliefs really are, and second, we must "consider which of our desires and beliefs fit best in the set of mental states, mental dispositions, and activities that we are attributing to ourselves" (p. 144). The first of these is clear; the second, as I understand it, asks us to create a fuller self-identity by fleshing out and making compatible the various beliefs and desires revealed to us in the first stage. This gives us a unified, transparent self.

Because this process -- which she calls "existential reflection" (p. 164) -- contributes to our self-identity as a whole, reflection "shapes the rationality of the self" (p. 144). Since we are all human, the process is constrained by "the invariants of human life" (p. 144): that life is finite, that it is lived in one direction in time, that the particular events we experience are impossible to erase and help form our sense of self (p. 166). Reasons for action arising from such reflection give our actions "existential justification": justification that is grounded partly in our particularity and partly in the generality of rationality. Such existential justifications are contrasted to three other forms: to "externalist" justifications -- since reasons are tied to an agent's particular sense of what is good and valuable, to mere means-end justifications -- since reflection and unity are required, and to the Rawlsian rationality of carrying out a life-plan -- since one's life is unpredictable and one's values change over time (p. 165).

Existential reflection thus informs us about our own sense of what is good and valuable, and the moral sphere then concerns a particular "moral good" that is a part of this more general good (p. 168). So what is morally justified is a subset of what is "existentially justified" (p. 168); moral reasons simply reflect an "impersonal" or "universal" point of view and typically concern the interests of others (p. 168). In her final chapter, Canto-Sperber argues that to understand the good in human life properly, one must posit a "formal good" that is grounded in existential justification, and is neither essentialist nor a mere adding up of preference-satisfactions.

This picture raises various questions; let me focus here on just two. First, how is existential justification meant to help us decide what to do? Since, as Canto-Sperber emphasizes, reflection happens over the course of an entire life, justifications for actions cannot always be fully understood at the time a decision is made. Indeed, on the model she presents, difficult decisions in cases of conflicting values depend on a "particular factor" about an agent, which may be related to the events of his particular life (p. 157) and may be revealed only after the fact (p. 151). For example, we cannot determine at the time whether Gauguin's decision to leave his family to go paint in Tahiti is justified, but later events may allow us to: if he is a success this justifies his action, but if he is a failure this renders invalid the justifications he gave to himself (p. 155).[4] While there's something intuitive about this picture, it isn't clear how it should help a person figure out how to act. And if moral reasons are grounded in such justifications, this seems to entail that we can never judge the moral quality of our action at the moment of decision. This may be true, but it is at odds with the claims in Part One about the importance of moral reasoning: why deliberate about morality if can we determine the qualities of our actions only in the future.

Second, and more centrally, why should we value the kind of reflection posited? In illustrating reflection's role, Canto-Sperber discusses Proust's Remembrance of Things Past. Here, Marcel (the narrator and protagonist), seeing vividly the possibility of his Albertine being a lesbian, is consumed with a desire that she stay close to him. Later, he finds living with her a torment, and he wonders whether his obsession with Albertine is really love. Canto-Sperber says that Marcel's feelings toward Albertine inform his idea of love and of himself, and that his reflection "attempts to elaborate some kind of compatibility" between conflicting reasons: those grounded in his idea of love, and those grounded in his torment. "This reflection would gradually help him better understand who he is" (p. 146).

But Proust's novel seems a strange choice for this illustration. Marcel never finds a way to render his various desires compatible with one another, and he remains, for all his thoughtfulness, at the mercy of feelings arising from incidental happenings and irrational fears. When Albertine is out of his sight he is consumed by jealousy and passion; when she is near his feelings change. While Marcel's reflection does seem to give him self-knowledge -- in contrast to others, he sees clearly that he is moved in these irrational ways -- his self-knowledge gives him no power over his feelings, no sense of a rational unified self, and no lessening of his misery. Indeed, the novel presents him as far less happy, and much more troubled, than the self-deceptive people around him. In this way the novel seems to present a challenge to Canto-Sperber's optimism: if reflection is a cause of unhappiness and does not give us control over powerful and destabilizing emotions, why must we lead the "examined life"?

Readers steeped in the Anglo-tradition philosophical literature regarding reasons will wonder: if reasons are "internal" -- grounded in an individual agent's actual beliefs and desires -- how can reflection lead to new desires and beliefs, and from there to happiness and a grasp of the (objectively) good life? As I understand it, Canto-Sperber's answer depends crucially on the importance of a unified self: it is in trying to make our conflicting feelings compatible that we see what true happiness is. The questions remain, however: what is so important about a unified self? How will simple reflection -- thinking -- move a person closer to it? What if an agent starts with a set of perverse desires and unifies them? These questions aren't fully answered here.

Because Moral Disquiet and Human Life takes on some of the deepest and most difficult problems in philosophy, I sometimes found myself wishing I was reading an imaginary volume two, a volume that would address the details of carrying out the project, pay sustained attention to examples from real life, and show how the various intuitions should be brought together. How, precisely, should moral reflection be carried out in order to be both rational in its methodology and sensitive to human subjectivity? How can personal reflection be grounded in the actual beliefs and desires of the agent, and still be transformative of his life?

[1] For instance, when the text says, "In any case, accounting for heterogeneity and confliction is often a prerequisite of moral objectivity" (p. 78), I assume this means, roughly, that views on which morality is objective must still accommodate diversity and conflict, but I'm not sure why one would say "accounting for" or "prerequisite," or what the word "often" is meant to convey, or why "confliction" instead of "conflict." This sentence is an extreme example, but much of the text left me slightly uncertain in similar ways of what exactly was meant.

[2] One thing that would improve this book a great deal is an introductory chapter explaining how these two parts are meant to fit together, since they both discuss morality and justification but seldom refer to each other.

[3] It seems strange in this context to say as a blanket statement that "No requirement, however morally justified, can ever transgress the value of negative freedom" (p. 77); I wondered here if the translation rendered this oddly, or if "negative freedom" was meant in some delimited way that wasn't spelled out.

[4] If he is killed in a shipwreck, the search for justification is permanently suspended.