Moral Exemplars in the Analects: The Good Person Is That

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Amy Olberding, Moral Exemplars in the Analects: The Good Person Is That, Routledge, 2012, 232pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415897051.

Reviewed by Myeong-seok Kim, Sung Kyun Kwan University


In this elegantly written book on Confucius and his Analects, Amy Olberding does a splendid job of explaining how the narrative depictions of Confucius in diverse circumstances collected in the Analects make a necessary complement to the more theoretically or conceptually oriented components of the book. Olberding argues that while the former is often skipped in embarrassment by many contemporary interpreters of the Analects, it actually reveals important aspects of human moral development and motivation that are not well captured by the text's conceptual schemata and that would even make us reconsider some recently presented virtue-ethical accounts of Confucius' thought. Specifically, Olberding focuses on Confucius' physical bearing or good manners in dealing with various situations, and argues that Confucius' demeanor regulated by the rituals () carries a personal style that arouses admiration in observers' minds by revealing something important about his character, i.e., how he feels and what he intends to do in the situation in question. For example, Olberding points out that "Confucius' solemn expression and inclined posture in his carriage when he encounters mourners . . . signals a sympathetic deference to the suffering of others." (113)

In order to explain this aspect of the Analects, Olberding adopts two key concepts: "aesthetics of character" (ibid.) and "physical empathy" (116). The first term was originally proposed by Nancy Sherman to capture the insight that we can develop a sense of a person's abiding character over time by observing the cumulative features of her habitual demeanor and physical bearing in various situations. This idea is related to Olberding's claim that the moral and the aesthetic are seamlessly interrelated in the Analects. That is, the "alliance" between these two is not an artificial amalgamation of two discrete evaluative domains but a kind of complex affective response having both moral and aesthetic aspects, and we come to have this experience when we observe moral exemplars' demeanor and admire them (93-94). The second term, "physical empathy," refers to our capacity to appreciate other people's movements or gestures based on our sense of what it would feel like if we were them. That is, everyone has a separate capacity called "proprioception," which is an ability to acquire information about the positions and movements of our own bodies through receptors in the joints, tendons, muscles, and so forth, and it is through some sort of proprioceptive empathy that we appreciate other people's movements and evaluate their grace (116).

So, if dancers often adjust their movements on the stage by their aesthetic sense that is proprioceptive, observers in the audience may evaluate the dancers' movements by remembering or imagining what it feels like to move as the dancers do. This is to postulate some sort of "mirroring system" between the mover and her observer, and whatever gracefulness an observer may find in a dancer's moves derives not only from watching the dancer but more importantly from "a mirrored felt sense of the dancer's gestures" (ibid.). Now, Olberding goes one step further and proposes that the same is also the case between moral exemplars and their observers in the Analects: the authors of the Analects observed Confucius' exemplary demeanor through proprioceptive empathy, and felt an admiration which is a complex experience that cannot be parsed into the moral and the aesthetic (117). Deeply related with this claim is Olberding's proposal that moral exemplars are identified in a pre-theoretical and direct manner (direct reference theory), and the adequacy of a moral theory partly rests on its capacity to justify our admiration of exemplars (18). According to her, this "exemplarist" reading of the Analects provides a much better framework than the previous virtue-ethical efforts to understand the text through the concepts of human nature and flourishing that are either anachronistic or theoretically unsuccessful in Olberding's view.

I think that Olberding's explanation of the rather prosaic and detailed descriptions of Confucius' demeanor in the Analects in terms of proprioceptive empathy makes a wonderful contribution to the study of the Analects at least in two respects. First, it enables us to understand (or explain) better the intentions of the text's authors in preserving so many detailed descriptions of their master and, second, it enables us to approach the text as a coherent whole with a clear theoretical outlook rather than a mere patchwork. However, I have some reservations about Olberding's ascription of exemplarism to the authors of the Analects, because I find some theoretical implications of this position quite controversial.

To begin with, let us examine Olberding's claim that the moral and the aesthetic are indistinguishable in the ethical exemplar's demeanor. She compares the exemplar's performance of ritually prescribed actions to the musical virtuoso's playing her instrument. That is, just as a good pianist does not merely strike a series of right notes scored by the composer but also conveys the proper mood by playing the piano with a personal style, the ethical exemplar does not just mechanically perform what is prescribed by the  but performs it with the right motivations and feelings (118-119). In my view, though, this analogy does not seem to hold completely. For I think, crudely put, whereas what matters most for the pianist is how gracefully or artistically she could express whatever feelings are supposed to be expressed by the musical piece, what makes the exemplar's demeanor nice or estimable is whether the exemplar's manners do express his abiding moral character. Based on this I submit that there is a clear enough distinction between the moral and aesthetic domains in general, and I suspect Confucius might have had this kind of distinction in mind when he said that the  music is completely beautiful but not completely good (Analects 3.25[1]) or that in mourning it is better to express real grief than to worry about formality (Analects 3.4).

Another big contention of Olberding's is that exemplars enjoy conceptual priority over abstract theory. According to her, there is no need to go beyond exemplars to the more abstract conceptual domain to look back and examine our experiences of exemplars; our inchoate admiration of them is so fundamental and trustworthy that any moral theory should only aim to confirm it and make it more intelligible (23). To support this view, she introduces Linda Zagzebski's exemplarist virtue theory and argues that our identification of exemplars is similar to identifying natural kinds such as water. This analogy is based on the direct reference theory which is meant to explain how a linguistic community can use natural kind terms appropriately without knowing the exact, technical descriptions of the properties of what those terms designate, and Olberding argues that we can likewise recognize the admirable qualities of exemplars without any fixed criteria conceived abstractly in advance (26). In her view, this point is corroborated by the finding that young children often develop a sensibility of what it is to be a good person without the help of complicated conceptual facilities by simply watching and imitating others, and in such children, she argues, the raw desire to be like an exemplar naturally develops into a basic evaluative judgment of the value of one's model (34).

However, this view seems to me to overemphasize the role of exemplars in our moral life and not to fit some textual evidence in the Analects. First, the very fact that moral exemplars are particular individuals living and interacting with others in concrete situations makes them human beings unable to escape having specific shortcomings or idiosyncrasies, and we need some general standards of virtues by which to challenge our exemplars when they seem to fall short of living up to the standards (cf. Analects 6.28, 11.10). Furthermore, exemplars are not always perfect; there are partial exemplars such as Zǐlù and Zǐgòng (disciples of Confucius'; see 136-179), and we need some general descriptions on the causes of their respective weaknesses and suitable remedies, not only to improve them but to improve ourselves too. In my view, Confucius' general remarks on how virtuous character traits can degenerate into vices and how this could be avoided (Analects 17.8) may have been developed by observing concrete cases, but once we have this general description in hand, we can apply it to anyone in history or in real life and see whether they make the same mistake or not. Second, I am not as optimistic as Olberding appears to be that most observers will find the exemplar naturally admirable or "imitably attractive" (64), partly because Confucius says that only the humane person can like or dislike people properly (Analects 4.3).

Finally, let me discuss Olberding's thesis that human nature and flourishing are anachronistic or unsuccessful conceptual tools for explaining the theoretical concerns of the authors of the Analects. According to her, it is often expected that a virtue ethic have a view of human nature as its theoretical foundation, but this kind of expectation reveals a concern for justification of morality that has only developed in the modern era (49-50). Moreover, she cites some contemporary interpreters' widely diverging views of human nature that they ascribe to Confucius, and rightly points out that there is little concern for the theory of human nature in the Analects (45-49). I fully agree with Olberding's latter observations. However, concerning her former assertion, it is not clear to me how she would explain, for example, Mencius' and Xunzi's theories of human nature that provide grounds for markedly different projects of human moral cultivation. Moreover, Confucian morality had started to be explicitly criticized by Mòzǐ, who distinguished morality (), a set of norms based on reasonable grounds, from customs (), merely arbitrary and often unreasonable practices.[2] Given this Mozian challenge, it is no wonder that ancient Confucians might have tried to justify their moral practices based on certain conceptions of human nature, and one may cautiously trace such an interest in human nature to Zǐgòng's complaint that his master did not talk about human nature (Analects 5.13).

Now, Olberding suggests that "flourishing" (eudaimonia) may be a viable term for describing the theoretical concerns of the authors of the Analects if an account of flourishing can provide sufficient motivations for morality. However, she eventually rejects this possibility based on the argument that flourishing, if it is the kind of life that only a virtuous person would find satisfactory, falls short of motivating ordinary people because what matters to them would be whether to adopt the virtuous person's point of view. As a solution to this problem, Olberding proposes that the exemplarist reading of the Analects answers this "why-be-moral question" by pre-empting the question itself, because "Our identification of exemplars occurs through our admiration of them and this . . . already contains a species of motivation" (64). From my perspective, though, this seems to be not pre-empting but begging the question, because it is not clear in the first place whether, or how many, ordinary people would actually find the exemplar admirable. According to Confucius, one's evaluation of others is colored by one's desires and values, and worthy people are supposed to be liked by the good people in the community and hated by the bad (Analects 13.24). I think that this is strong evidence against Olberding's exemplarist reading of the Analects.

However, let us grant for the sake of the argument that most of us do admire the exemplary person and come to have an inherent motivation to be like her. In such a case too, though, we encounter a problem because, as Olberding correctly anticipates, our motivation inherent in our admiration of the exemplar will compete with much that hinders us from enacting this desire. Concerning this issue, Olberding argues that although unable to identify fully with the virtuous person's life style, one may still aspire to be like her to the extent that one's admiration of her remains motivating, and this makes possible an ordinary species of morality (64-65). However, this is exactly what Rǎn Yǒu, a very talented disciple of Confucius, reported to his master as his problem: "It is not that I do not like your Way, but I'm short of power." (Analects 6.12) Confucius' response to this was far from providing an effective solution, and Olberding's exemplarism does not seem to do any better than Confucius. Perhaps the use of the concept of flourishing in the context of the Analects may be found elsewhere. In response to Magistrate of Shè who told Confucius that somebody called "upright Gōng" in his district reported his father's crime to the government, Confucius says that the upright people in his village cover up for their families (Analects 13.18). As I see it, this episode well illustrates that Confucius' policy about dealing with the crimes of one's family members is based on his specific conception of the flourishing life for human beings, and one of the purposes of having such a conception in the Analects is to provide justification for one's more concrete policies and proposals.

These are some of the considerations that Olberding should address to make her exemplarist interpretation of the Analects more recommendable, although I simultaneously think that her work is definitely a wonderful contribution to the scholarship on the Analects and already achieves a lot.

[1] The passage numbers of the Analects provided here are according to Roger T. Ames and Henry Rosemont, Jr., trans., The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation (New York: Ballantine Books, 1998).

[2] See the chapter of "Jiézàng" (frugal funerals) in Sūn Yíràng, Mòzǐ xiángǔ (Běijīng: Zhōnghuá shūjú, 2001), 187-189.