Moral Relativism, Moral Diversity, and Human Relations

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Kellenberger, James, Moral Relativism, Moral Diversity, and Human Relations, Penn State University Press, 2001, 236 pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-271-02149-7

Reviewed by Louis P. Pojman, U.S. Military Academy


In Moral Relativism, Moral Diversity, and Human Relations James Kellenberger explores the nature and value of moral relativism as it relates to moral diversity. He examines this perennial metaethical issue through the lens of a theory of human relations, which claims that our moral life is based on our encounters with other human beings, explaining “what is right and wrong about moral relativism and moral absolutism, to go further and explain the grounding of those pretheoretical intuitions that peremptorily recommend each” (p. 7). Examining the work of such ethical relativists as John Ladd, Gilbert Harman and David Wong, Kellenberger defines moral absolutism as the doctrine that there is one true morality which applies universally to all people everywhere; and moral relativism as the denial of this doctrine. He examines the problem from the perspective of religion, anthropology, and cultural studies, ranging from the Eskimo practice of parricide to the African practice of clitorodectomy. Cultural diversity exhibits many different moral frameworks, and moral relativism asserts that none of them is “more correct than the others.” Cultural diversity in itself doesn’t establish moral relativism, which holds that the justification of a moral framework is acceptance by a people within a culture. Much of the defense of Kellenberger’s moral absolutism is based on the work of moral pluralists, such as Michael Walzer, Elizabeth Wolgast, and especially, John Kekes, whose theory appears in every chapter of the book. The pluralists are moral absolutists who argue that the basic universal values manifest themselves differently in different cultural frameworks. “There are some candidates for universal values that recur with some regularity on the lists of anthropologists, political scientists, and moral philosophers. Universal values, for some, include a prohibition against murder, the value of the family, and truth telling.” (p. 41)

Kellenberger puts forth the Principle of Ascent to account for this unity within plurality. This asserts that when we see cultures having seemingly incompatible practices, if we examine and take into account background conditions and beliefs, we will often find a common value as the explanation of the practice. He gives the example of the practice of live burial of the Dinka tribe of the southern Sudan. The Dinkas bury their aged spear-master alive in a pile of cattle dung, causing him to suffocate in excrement. On the surface this practice seems contrary to our principle of caring for the aged, but when further examined, it turns out that the spear-master chooses this form of euthanasia for himself, as a means of passing on his spirit to the community. Diverse burial practices, such as Eskimos abandoning their elderly, similarly reveal a concern to ensure the survival of the group in the midst of scarce resources. The classic case of opposing practices of disposing of the dead is recorded by the ancient Greek historian, Herodotus. He tells us that the Greeks burned their dead, whereas the Callatians ate their dead, each being appalled by the other’s “callous disregard”. This case, which has often been taken as the paradigm of ethical relativism, is revealed by the Principle of Ascent to be two applications of the value of respecting one’s deceased loved ones. The idea is not new, but Kellenberger’s labeling of it is helpful, and his subsequent discussion is broad and insightful. In a further discussion he locates the idea in Thomas Aquinas’ theory of natural law and shows how Christianity, Islam, Buddhism and Hinduism each manifest a common set of overlapping values. His discussion of morality in world religions, though cursory, is fascinating and illustrative of his thesis of unity within plurality.

Kellenberger wants to give moral relativism its due and acknowledges that there is an intuitive appeal in that direction. It does seem that different cultures manifest different moral norms, that recognizing that other cultures are different mitigates against arrogance and cultural imperialism, and that appreciating such difference will cause us to be more tolerant. He fails to note, however, that in appealing to the value of tolerance in this way, the relativist is treating tolerance as an objective value. On the other hand, if a culture values intolerance, the relativist is committed to endorse that as equally valid as a view that values tolerance. The weaknesses of moral relativism include an inability to say that one moral framework is better than another, let alone to judge a culture as evil, and a failure to make sense of intercultural conflict. The relativist cannot make sense of universal justice or human rights. Moreover, there is a problem of defining just what a culture consists in. Is it simply a set of beliefs and practices? Then why cannot a group of psychopaths or sadists form their own culture? The author doesn’t discuss this pressing problem.

Ultimately, Kellenberger contends, our common human nature gives rise to common needs and desires out of which a universal morality arises—though it does so in a variety of ways.

Kellenberger’s solution to the relativism/absolutism debate is to ground morality in personal relations, in what he calls “person/person relationships.” Each person has a relationship to every person, including those unseen whom he will never meet. It includes a relationship to ourselves. Using common relationships such as friendship and marriage, he argues that relationships manifest universal norms of behavior. Unfortunately, Kellenberger does not tell us what it is to be a person (are higher animals persons?) nor does he argue for his thesis that the person/person relationship is the foundation of all morality (how can we have obligations to future persons?). Instead he holds the thesis as an undefined primitive, a foundational principle which he amply illustrates, but doesn’t argue for. He seems to hold a Christian/Kantian view that human beings have inherent equal dignity, so that it is wrong to violate that dignity. Since many philosophers holding a more naturalist account of humanity as simply evolved animals have difficulty locating a doctrine of equal inherent worth in human beings, humanist-optimists like Kellenberger need to deal with the objections to the transcendental thesis. By virtue of what characteristic do all human beings or persons have equal and positive value? The alternative is to see morality as an artifact necessary for civilization, an instrument designed to promote our biologically-based, but culturally shaped desires and needs. Kellenberger would, no doubt, reject such evolutionary accounts of morality, but he owes us an account of persons, the source of their inherent dignity, and the moral absolutism he embraces that does more than simply recognize plurality of cultural manifestations, unified under the Principle of Ascent.

Along these same lines, one would like to see a discussion of the function or purpose of morality. If morality functions to promote certain needs or desires, then it would seem that certain behavioral rules would serve those desiderata better than others. Some practices like promise-keeping, truth-telling, prohibition on killing, and reciprocity would seem constitutive of any valid morality. Kellenberger mentions these features as common vital features of all moralities, but fails to provide a comprehensive grounding of them in the very nature of morality. I suspect this is due to a deontological (or anti-consequentialist) commitment.

In the end, this book adds little to our understanding of the nature of morality. It offers an insightful and suggestive survey of the ancient and recent literature (including a catalogue of material from world religions and cultural anthropology) on moral relativism and moral pluralism, which surely justifies the book. But we are left with an unexamined assumption that morality is based on a view of all humans as having inherent equal dignity. Those who don’t have that intuition may have an epiphany to convert them, but they will not find any argument to persuade them.