Moral Responsibility: the Ways of Scepticism

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Carlos J. Moya, Moral Responsibility: the Ways of Scepticism, Routledge, 2006, 233pp., $113.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415371953.

Reviewed by Matthew Talbert, University of California, San Diego


The first four chapters of this book develop an argument for skepticism about moral responsibility, while the fifth presents an original libertarian account of moral responsibility intended to meet the skeptical challenge posed by the earlier chapters. Moya's route to skepticism will be familiar to readers acquainted with contemporary debates over the compatibility of free will and determinism. On the one hand, Moya argues that if physical determinism is true (and at any point in time there is only one physically possible extension of the actual past), then human beings lack the sort of free will required for moral responsibility. If, on the other hand, determinism is false, then human agents are not likely to have the kind of control over their actions required for moral responsibility. To counter this last claim, Moya develops an indeterministic account of moral responsibility that focuses on responsibility for beliefs rather than on responsibility for choices and actions. Moya argues that this focus allows for an account on which moral responsibility depends on the falsity of determinism but is consistent with indeterminism.

The organization of this book reflects the structure of the following argument for skepticism about moral responsibility (SMR):

A: Either determinism is true or it is not true.

B: If determinism is true, moral responsibility is not possible.

C: If determinism is not true, moral responsibility is not possible.

D: Therefore moral responsibility is not possible. (5-6)

Chapter 1 begins with a defense of premise A, but its focus is on premise B, which is supported by the "Incompatibilist Argument" (IA). This argument has two premises: (1) access to alternate possibilities in choice and action is required for moral responsibility; but (2) determinism rules out such access. Moya defends the second premise of IA with Peter van Inwagen's "Consequence Argument." According to this argument, if determinism is true, then all present events (including all human actions) are consequences of the laws of nature taken together with facts about the past. Since no one has power over the laws of nature or facts about the past, no one has power over their consequences. Thus, if determinism is true, we do not have genuine access to alternate possibilities when we act. Moya provides a helpful and up-to-date account of the debate over the validity of the Consequence Argument and the inference principles on which it relies; he concludes that the argument is (or can be made to be) valid and that premise 2 of IA is therefore well founded.

However, the security of premise B of SMR also depends on establishing the claim that moral responsibility indeed requires alternate possibilities. Chapter 2 provides limited support for this claim by defending it against counterexamples modeled on a proposal of Harry Frankfurt's. In these "Frankfurt cases," although an agent performs an action in the normal way, if she had shown signs of acting differently, then external forces would have intervened and caused her to act just as she actually did. Frankfurt cases separate responsibility from access to alternate possibilities by presenting us with agents who could not have acted otherwise but who are nonetheless responsible for their actions because they brought them about in the normal way.

Moya argues that most Frankfurt cases either rely on the assumption of determinism (in which case an incompatibilist will not agree that the featured agent is responsible), or allow access to some relevant alternate possibility. Other proposals (e.g., "actual blockage" cases) avoid this dilemma. Agents in these cases will perform a certain action no matter what, even though determinism does not obtain. However, since the agent will perform the action no matter what, he will do so even if he judges that there is strong reason not to, in which case the agent's "reasons for decision and his decisions come dramatically apart," and he is insufficiently responsive to reasons to be held responsible (53).

Chapter 2 is a thorough and occasionally innovative account of the debates surrounding Frankfurt cases; it would usefully supplement primary readings in a course on agency. However, the refutation of Frankfurt cases does not provide by itself decisive support for the claim that moral responsibility requires alternate possibilities. After all, the failure of Frankfurt cases does not necessarily impugn detailed presentations of compatibilism such as R. Jay Wallace's Responsibility and the Moral Sentiments (Harvard, 1994), which advocates compatibilism based on consideration of our actual moral practices and not on assumptions about the merit of Frankfurt cases. In Responsibility and Control (Cambridge, 1998), John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza use Frankfurt cases to focus our attention on the actual sequence that leads to an action, and we see that responsibility involves guiding our actions based on receptivity to reasons rather than involving an ability to extend the past in more than one way. However, Fischer and Ravizza's account does not stand or fall with the final persuasiveness of Frankfurt cases.

Chapter 3 addresses the above point insofar as it supports premise B of SMR independently of the Incompatibilist Argument and in view of a fuller treatment of compatibilist theories. Support for premise B follows from the following combined claims: (1) genuine moral responsibility for an action implies that an agent has ultimate control over that action in the sense of being the ultimate source of that action; and (2) determinism is incompatible with ultimate control and sourcehood.

We think of ourselves as sources of changes in the world brought about by our actions and as being appropriate targets for criticism or commendation on this account. However, if we are not the ultimate sources of our actions because our choices and actions result partly from factors that are not under our control (for instance, from unchosen facts about our circumstances or upbringings), then our agency is merely a conduit of change, in which case we are not appropriate targets of praise and blame. Such reflections can lead to the conclusion that responsibility for an action requires being the ultimate source of that action, but this sourcehood is incompatible with determinism because determinism implies that any contribution we make to our actions was itself caused by a prior, causally sufficient input.

Since determinism is incompatible with ultimate sourcehood and control, the challenge for compatibilists is to give a plausible account of moral responsibility that does not rely on this condition. Moya argues that prominent compatibilist theories do not meet this challenge. On contemporary "structural" accounts of responsibility, an agent is responsible for an action if it issues from his appropriately structured will. These theories are "ahistorical" because as long as the appropriate structural relations characterize an agent's will, it is immaterial how these structures were brought about. Moya argues that ahistorical theories are unsatisfactory because agents who are subject to certain kinds of conditioning might satisfy the proposed requirements on responsibility, even though these agents are less than fully responsible on account of their conditioning. According to Moya, Fischer and Ravizza's explicitly historical account of responsibility is open to a similar objection. On their theory, responsibility requires that an agent owns his reasons-responsive mechanism, where "ownership" results from a historical process. Moya sees this ownership requirement as a "surrogate of the ultimate control condition," but argues it is too weak to play this role because we can imagine conditioning scenarios that undermine responsibility but satisfy the ownership requirement (125).

Chapter 4 defends premise C of SMR, the claim that indeterminism undermines responsibility. This chapter offers a clear account of Robert Kane's event-causal theory of free will. Kane's theory makes room for ultimate control by introducing the device of Self-Forming Willings (SFWs). SFWs are efforts of will that settle a choice about what to do in certain circumstances: they also contribute to an agent's character and volitional tendencies, but are not caused by dispositions or character traits.

Moya presses versions of the "Mind Argument" against Kane. According to Moya, while Kane's account gives "clear sense to the idea of ultimacy of source," insofar as it "denies agents in SFW situations comprehensive reflective standards … it stumbles on the problem of their rational and volitional control" (153). The idea is that since indeterministic accounts allow that all of an agent's dispositions, deliberations, and motivations may not fully determine whether she performs an action, it is unclear how her actual performance of the action is under her rational control.

Kane argues that while SFWs are undetermined, agents have control over how a SFW situation turns out because the agent makes the self-forming choice he wants most to make. However, what the agent "wants most" does not derive from prior commitments or dispositions. Rather, the choice itself defines what the agent wants most. Moya argues that this definitional link between "reasons that the agent wants most to act on" and "reasons that the agent actually acts on" distorts the notion of choosing for a reason (154). He concludes that choices in a SFW situation issue from a "sheer, baseless decision," insufficient to support the kind of rational control necessary for responsibility (154).

In Chapter 5, Moya responds to the skeptical argument he has constructed. Up to this point, it appears impossible to achieve both ultimate and rational control over our choices and actions. Moya suggests that this appearance is an artifact of theorists' focus on responsibility for choices, and he proposes that ultimate control and rational control can be seen to fit together if we shift the focus of responsibility assessments to responsibility for beliefs and other cognitive states.

It should be admitted that agents' beliefs and judgments play a role in our assessments of their responsibility and Moya is correct that we often "praise or blame someone for an action in so far as we see this action as a sign of, or as flowing from, her [praiseworthy or condemnable] evaluative attitudes" (182). If beliefs play a fundamental role in responsibility ascriptions, then, Moya reasons, the control necessary for such ascriptions is control over beliefs. However, the control we enjoy over beliefs is not voluntary control. Consider the cognitive achievement involved in Isaac Newton writing the Principia. According to Moya, Newton's "rational control" over this process did not consist "in voluntary acts or choices, but, to a large extent, in his passively yielding to the internal requirements and structure of the subject itself" (178).

Moreover, we attribute to Newton ultimate control over his achievement since we believe that he "deserves our unrestricted praise and gratitude" for it (177). Importantly, we regard Newton this way even though we are aware that the cognitive achievements of others had to be in place before he could successfully produce a work like the Principia. Thus, Moya concludes that ultimate control over beliefs and judgments does not require the sort of ultimate sourcehood that a skeptic might insist is necessary for responsibility for actions.

The skeptic just mentioned would hold that an agent is not responsible for her actions because, for example, factors over which she had no choice played a role in her becoming the sort of agent she is. However, this skeptic might also hold that Newton's cognitive achievements are (contrary to Moya's assertion) not truly his own because they are not fully explicable in terms of Newton's contributions. One might object, then, that the example of Newton (and other examples Moya provides) does not really demonstrate that cognitive achievements involve a novel type of ultimate control. Rather, Moya's interpretation of the example just denies the relevance of the skeptic's ultimate control conditions on responsibility for actions and cognitive achievements. In this case, it is unclear why another theorist, even a compatibilist, could not similarly reject the skeptic's proposal that moral responsibility requires an unachievable ultimate sourcehood in favor of more reasonable constraints on responsibility. But if we can reject this condition on responsibility, then only the Incompatibilist Argument supports premise B of SMR, which is insufficient for the reasons I gave above.

As an incompatibilist proposal, Moya's belief-centered account requires indeterminism. It could be "bottom-up" indeterminism, which is the sort that obtains if quantum indeterminacies in the brain are transmitted to higher-level psychological states like beliefs (195). Moya judges that reliance on "bottom-up" indeterminism is what opens libertarian theories to the Mind objection. Instead, Moya commits himself to "top-down" indeterminism, which "holds primarily at 'higher' levels of reality, especially at the level of rule-governed, normative systems" (196). Normative systems are indeterministic in several ways: for instance, a "system's normative standards do not determine one single way of complying with (or breaking) them" and there is "room for reasoned discussion about whether a particular situation is one to which a certain normative judgment applies" (196).

According to Moya, the higher-order indeterminism of a normative system is encoded in human agents through the process of education that inducts us into these systems. For example, a body of elastic rules governs the playing of the guitar, and as a student learns the application of these rules, his training establishes a complex series of neural connections in his brain. This neural configuration is explained by "the objective content of normative systems, institutions and practices related to music and guitar playing" and "the several indeterministic levels involved in those systems and practices have come to shape the structure of the brain and nervous system of the learner" (200).

This picture may be accurate, but it is not clear that the sort of indeterminism involved in normative systems and practices like reasoning and resolving disputes threatens compatibilism. This is because it is not clear that the form of indeterminism in question is inconsistent with physical determinism. After all, if we discovered that physical determinism obtains, it is unlikely that we would come to regard our various normative systems as inflexible and not open to diverse interpretations.

It is plausible to suppose that if a kind of indeterminism is inconsistent with physical determinism, then this indeterminism is constituted by the failure of the laws of nature, taken together with the facts about the past, to determine a unique future. If we think that the sort of indeterminism inherent in normative systems is incompatible with physical determinism, then this is probably because we see such systems as governed by bottom-up indeterminism. After all, we would explain the failure of facts about the past and the laws of nature to fix the facts about a normative system in terms of the failure of the facts and laws to fix low-level physical facts (if we believe that the facts about a normative system supervene on facts about the physical world). Since Moya is clear that the sort of indeterminism he has in mind is not bottom-up, it is not obvious that his account is incompatible with physical determinism, in which case it may not put direct pressure on compatibilism. So, while Moya's book offers a clear and detailed account of many of the issues relating to the compatibility of responsibility and determinism, it is not clear that he has delivered an account of responsibility that is consistent with indeterminism but depends on the falsity of determinism, as the latter concept is ordinarily understood in this debate.