Moral Rights and Their Grounds

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David Alm, Moral Rights and Their Grounds, Routledge, 2019, 257pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138102590.

Reviewed by Julian Culp, American University of Paris


This book is an acute study that explores three fundamental questions about moral rights: what are moral rights, which moral rights exist, and what are the grounds of moral rights? In the first of its three parts, David Alm focuses on the first question and presents his value view regarding the nature of moral rights. Then, in Parts II and III he discusses the so-called agency view and exercise-based rights view in order to respond to the second and third questions. In answering all of these questions, Alm aims at resolving the following puzzle about moral rights: "If we have moral rights at all, surely we can lose them. But if we have them simply because we are persons . . . how could we lose them?" (p. vii) Indeed, at least prima facie, it does seem plausible to believe both that moral rights can be lost and that we possess moral rights simply because we are persons. But if we maintain that certain features of our personhood -- our capacity for judgment and choice, say -- ground moral rights, then how can we actually lose these rights when this loss does not entail the removal of these features? This suggests that we actually might not be able to lose moral rights. Yet in some cases the loss of at least some moral rights appears very hard to deny. Consider, for example, the loss of the moral right not to be imprisoned after having committed a brutal crime. But, again, those who have supposedly lost such moral rights usually maintain the morally significant features of their personhood such as, for example, the (mental) capacity to choose and judge. It is this puzzle -- how to reconcile the loss of rights with the idea that we possess moral rights in virtue of certain aspects of our personhood -- that Alm addresses.

Different grounds of moral rights, grounds that do not consist of our personhood, can do a better job of explaining the loss of moral rights. One possible example is what Alm calls an "exercise-based" (p. viii) view of the grounds of moral rights. This view posits that persons' possession of moral rights depends on how morally they act and, in particular, hinges on the extent to which their actions violate and respect moral rights. An obvious implication of this view, one which might be helpful for resolving said puzzle, is that on this account persons can lose moral rights by violating moral rights. The problem with such an exercise-based view of the grounds of moral rights, however, is that it is incompatible with the intuition that no matter how immorally persons act, they will nevertheless maintain at least some moral rights such as, for example, the moral right to be treated fairly. Yet in order to account for this intuition that at least some moral rights cannot be lost and are in this particular sense "inalienable," it seems that we must not endorse a view of the grounds of moral rights that accounts for the loss of moral rights on the basis of our moral rights-violating actions. For such a view might lead to the conclusion that persons can lose all of their moral rights if they act immorally.

An alternative view of the grounds of moral rights that actually can explain this kind of inalienability of moral rights is the already mentioned view that appeals to certain morally significant features of our personhood that we do not necessarily lose when pursuing moral rights-violating actions. Yet again, that view, as has already been clarified, cannot make good sense of the phenomenon of the loss of moral rights. This is why a more complex view of the grounds of moral rights is needed, as Alm argues, one that can explain the loss of moral rights as well as the inalienability of moral rights.

The view that Alm eventually offers is a "hybrid view" that represents "a comprise" between the exercise-based view, on the one hand, and the so-called agency-view, on the other (pp. 238, ix). The latter view holds that agency is a morally significant feature of our personhood in virtue of which we possess moral rights. More specifically, this agency-view asserts that persons have value in virtue of their capacity to form and pursue reasons for action. For the articulation of this view Alm draws on James Griffin's notion of "normative agency" (Griffin 2008, p. 45). Combining the agency-based view with the exercise-based view, Alm labels the resulting view as the "agency-exercise view of rights," which he summarizes as follows: "Each right of a person is a value belonging to him either because of his agency or because of his abuses or non-abuses of his agency" (p. 238). Further refining this view, Alm clarifies that respecting the moral rights that are solely grounded on someone's agency is required "to treat him as a person at all" (p. 238). By contrast, properly recognizing the moral rights of a person that are grounded on that person's moral rights-violating and moral rights-respecting actions, which are the most relevant actions for determining a person's "abuses and non-abuses of his agency," means showing due respect to him as person.

As the quoted definition of Alm's agency-exercise conception of moral rights has already indicated, this conception draws on a distinct value view regarding the nature of moral rights. The value view maintains that moral rights represent a special kind of value of the rights holder, in virtue of which others are under a moral obligation to act in certain ways. Following Joseph Raz (1986, pp. 186, 192, 249), Alm understands such an obligation as having "pre-emptive" or "preemptory" force, which means, as Alm puts it, that the duty bearers must show "some performance . . . [and] have reason not to act on at least some reasons that tell against that performance" (p. 24). In Alm's terminology, this means that the special value that moral rights constitute consists of the generation of not only a "first-order" reason for a certain action but also of a "second-order," exclusionary reason not to act for other "first-order" reasons against that action (ibid.).

This value view is distinct from the well-known "benefit-" or "interest-theory" of moral rights, because it does not conceive moral rights as being instrumental to the promotion of the right holder's well-being or some other valuable state of affairs. As Alm clarifies, the point of the value view regarding the nature of moral rights is not that we ought "to promote value" of a certain kind -- e.g., the well-being of a person -- but rather that "we ought to honor or respect [the] value" (p. 43) of a person. And honoring the value of a person means recognizing that her value generates a second-order, exclusionary reason to treat her in morally appropriate ways that are respectful of the value of a person. Thus it is because a person has moral value that she has to be treated in a particular way, and it is not because that particular treatment brings about a certain value that such treatment is morally demanded.

Yet what, according to the value view, amounts to a morally appropriate treatment? Or, to put this question in terms of the second fundamental question about moral rights listed at the outset, Which moral rights exist? In order to respond to this question, Alm relies on the agency view and offers a rather vague picture of a certain "domain of control" (p. 98) to which moral rights entitle persons. Somewhat more precisely, Alm argues in favor of a "right to control," which he understands "as a right to a 'decent set of options'" (p. 105). By that he means that when persons engage in making long term plans they should be able to choose among different options -- not just any kind of options, however, but valuable ones. These options are valuable if their pursuit allows persons to follow their conception of a fulfilling life. This understanding of the contents of moral rights complements Alm's conception of the nature, grounds and contents of moral rights. His conception is sophisticated and attractive. Nevertheless it seems as if it would have to be developed further in order to be able to properly explain how to deal with disagreements about moral rights and how to conceive the relation between moral rights and legal rights.

To elaborate, Alm's conception of moral rights does not engage with the unavoidable fact that there is moral and, especially, political disagreement regarding the particular sets of options persons should possess. For example, should the domain of control to which persons have a moral right include the right to democratic participation? Or should health care be regarded as a necessary element of a set of valuable options? Persons will disagree on how to answer these questions. The notion of a decent set of valuable options easily lends itself to a plurality of plausible interpretations.

Yet Alm's conception is void of any ideas about how to deal with such moral and political disagreement. He does not defend any moral right that would somehow illuminate what a morally appropriate way of engaging in such a conflict would amount to. But determining what such morally appropriate engagement means is a crucial moral and practical task given that such disagreement about the meaning of moral rights for a decent set of options is unavoidable. Rainer Forst, for example, has recently argued that all persons possess a fundamental moral "right to justification" (Forst 2012, passim) in virtue of which all persons should count whenever it comes to justifying which (other) moral rights there are.

Related to this last point, but also more generally, Alm's conception of moral rights and their grounds is focused quite narrowly on the morally significant features of individual persons and the kinds of more or less moral lives they lead as normative agents. It neglects, that is, the political and legal questions that immediately arise once one situates the normative agency of individual persons within the wider local, national and global contexts in which they are embedded. Alm neither explores whether there are any moral rights to participate in the public opinion- and will-formation about which moral rights should be legally recognized, nor does he offer any reflections about the relationship between moral and legal rights. Yet given the fundamental importance that domestic and international legal (human) rights presently have for addressing moral conflicts, determining the relation between moral and legal rights is imperative if the moral theory is meant to have any practical purchase. This is especially so given that it must no longer be simply taken for granted that legal (human) rights somehow "mirror" moral rights, as Allen Buchanan (2013, passim) has recently argued.

Despite these problems with Alm's conception that become apparent once one begins thinking through some of its practical and political implications, his book will be of great interest not only to analytically oriented moral philosophers, but also to political and legal philosophers with an interest in the meta-ethical and normative-ethical analyses of rights. Alm masters the contemporary debates on the nature, contents and grounds of moral rights. In addition, his hybrid view offers a plausible solution to the puzzle of how to reconcile the phenomenon of the loss of moral rights with the idea that moral rights are inalienable because we possess them in virtue of our personhood.


Buchanan, Allen. 2013. The Heart of Human Rights. New York: Oxford University Press.

Forst, Rainer. 2012. The Right to Justification. New York: Columbia University Press.

Griffin, James. 2008. On Human Rights. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Raz, Joseph. 1986. The Morality of Freedom. Oxford: Oxford University Press.