Morality and War: Can War Be Just in the Twenty-First Century?

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David Fisher, Morality and War: Can War Be Just in the Twenty-First Century?, Oxford University Press, 2011, 303pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599240.

Reviewed by Saba Bazargan, University of California at San Diego


The most distinctive feature of this book on the morality of war is that its author, David Fisher, was a senior official in the Ministry of Defence, Foreign Office, and Cabinet Office in the UK and served as defense adviser to the Prime Minister and UK Defence Counsellor to NATO. In particular, as the senior defense official within the UK Cabinet Office from 1997 through 1999, Fisher was responsible for coordinating government policy on Iraq. The book is his thesis for a doctorate in War Studies.

Fisher sets the bar high by devoting a quarter of his book to criticism and analysis of contemporary metaethics and normative ethics, after which he develops his own account to undergird the traditional principles of just war theory. But unfortunately, Fisher's understanding of metaethics and normative ethics is simplistic and outdated. His subsequent analysis of just war theory largely ignores (except for the occasional criticism of David Rodin) the burgeoning work that has been done in the field of just war over the past decade. The second part of the book, in which he morally assesses modern wars and salient issues surrounding modern warfare, fares better, since he can bring to bear his considerable experience in international politics.

In the introduction and first chapter, Fisher discusses the pernicious influence of moral anti-realism on political and cultural discourse in general, and in war specifically. Here, and again in chapter 7, he suggests that analytic philosophers bear a substantial share of the blame for the prevalence of 'relativism' in Western society. Fisher vastly overestimates the influence that we philosophers have on hoi polloi and on political discourse. Insofar as we do have influence, he gets things backwards -- analytic philosophy, in the past 50 years, has been a bulwark against the influence of poststructuralist thought. Fisher also frequently laments that most metaethicists are anti-realists (2). But to show that Fisher is mistaken, one need not name the scores of influential moral realists; according to the recent PhilPapers Surveys, only 27.8% of Philosophy PhDs with a specialization in metaethics indicated that they "accept or lean toward" moral anti-realism.

Having painted a picture of contemporary ethicists as culturally and politically influential anti-realists, Fisher then, in chapter 2, attempts to explain and debunk all major forms of anti-realism. In so doing, he ignores the impressive array of tools that anti-realists have developed to meet precisely the sorts of challenges he raises. In chapter 3, Fisher presents his positive metaethical account, which he takes to dissolve the problems raised by anti-realists. He argues that we ought to act in ways that promote human flourishing. He contrasts this account with enlightened egoism, which, he convincingly argues, pares off our individual interests from the interests of others in ways that yield a descriptively incomplete account of human interaction. But his attempt to provide a metaethical basis for the intrinsic value of human flourishing falls victim to the Humean version of the naturalistic fallacy: he claims that our natural, communitarian instincts ground the moral value of human flourishing. As a result, his positive account doesn't respond to the skeptic's challenge; it simply ignores it. (Of course, setting aside anti-realist challenges is perfectly appropriate in a book on applied ethics. But Fisher believes it is imperative to respond to the anti-realist's challenge, due to the insidious influence it has had on political and cultural discourse.)

The value of human flourishing partly grounds a normative ethical account which he calls "Virtue Consequentialism." This account is teleological, in that, in Moorean fashion, it identifies a good state of affairs to be brought about, viz., human flourishing. It is also deontological in that there are certain intrinsic values which cannot be represented in a consequentialist axiology. And it is aretaic, in that these intrinsic values consist in leading a virtuous life.

Fisher reaches Virtue Consequentialism by first rejecting deontological, consequentialist, and aretaic accounts of normative ethics, in chapters 3 and 7. But he rejects, at best, a caricature of these theories. Fisher rejects consequentialism on the grounds that intentions matter. But a contemporary consequentialist would point out that the intrinsic value of good and bad intentions can be grounded in a consequentialist axiology. Fisher rejects deontology on the grounds that sometimes consequences matter. But a contemporary deontologist is committed only to the much weaker view that sometimes consequences are not all that matters. It is no surprise, given Fisher's incomplete understanding of these theories, that he rejects them.

In chapters 4 and 5, he reaffirms and attempts to justify the principles of the just war tradition. But many of Fisher's arguments in favor of traditional just war principles have already been subjected to withering attacks by others. For example, Fisher claims that the basis of liability to be attacked is posing a threat (78, 174). He seems unaware of the sustained decade-long criticism of this view: if posing a threat is a basis of liability to attack, then, absurdly, a mugger has a right to attack her victim if the victim engages in justified self-defense. Fisher also claims that if we deny the moral equivalence of combatants, then there would be no incentive for combatants on the unjust side to moderate their actions (71). But here he confuses legality and morality; there might be consequentialist reasons to adopt a convention, enshrined in law, which immunizes combatants on all sides in a war from prosecution for participation in an unjust war. This is consistent with claiming that those who participate in an unjust war are acting immorally and thus ought not to do so.

In chapter 6, Fisher delineates the virtues and applies them to military conduct. To avoid military indiscipline characterized by the murderous rampage of US Marines in Haditha, he argues that "morality needs to be afforded high priority and salience within the military curriculum" (130). He reaches this conclusion by relying on abductive explanations of military indiscipline: soldiers act badly because they are not virtuous. But this is a hyper-moralized account of military indiscipline. Except insofar as he identifies a dearth of moral instruction as a cause of unvirtuous conduct, Fisher ignores non-normative explanations of military indiscipline.

For example, he does not consider the intimate role that the justice of a war plays in the behavior of soldiers. As others who have written on war have noted (see especially chapter 2 of Peter French's book "War and Moral Dissonance"), soldiers who witness the gruesome deaths of their comrades need to know that their comrades did not die in vain -- the most natural way to make sense of these deaths is to advert to the value of the cause for which they are fighting. At the outset of the war in Iraq, military and civilian leaders were able to furnish such putative aims. But when it became clear that Saddam Hussein's regime was not stockpiling WMDs, the war's putative aims became unfixed and inchoate; soldiers came to justifiably believe that the war's strategic aims were grounded not in morality but in political expediency. To claim, as Fisher does, that these soldiers ought to act virtuously is normatively perverse: from their perspective we ask them not only to die for nothing, but to embody the cardinal virtues while they do so.

To his credit, Fisher stresses that all levels of command in the military, as well as the state's political structure, and even society itself as a whole, must be oriented toward the virtues before we can realistically expect soldiers to consistently act virtuously. But given partial compliance, Fisher seems to have no qualms with demanding virtuous conduct among soldiers whose leaders do not seem to care about them.

In this context, perhaps a virtuous soldier ought to disobey orders to fight in the Iraqi war. But Fisher summarily rejects this possibility later in the book, on the grounds that such orders were lawful and that it was not obvious that the war was unjust (252). But (non-trivial) uncertainty regarding the justness of the war would itself require disobeying an order to fight. To participate in a war that might very well be unjust risks deliberately killing individuals who have a right not to be killed. Of course, refusing to participate in a war that might very well be just risks allowing the deliberate killing of individuals who have a right not to be killed. But all things being equal, killing unjustly is morally worse than allowing an unjust killing (as Fisher himself affirms) -- which is why, in times of uncertainty, we must err on the side of the former. The upshot is that it seems virtue requires more of soldiers than that they abide by jus in bello, and it will likely require more of them than Fisher is prepared to accept.

Against the claim that a virtuous soldier ought to disobey an order to fight in the Iraqi war, Fisher cites the dangerous precedent that is set when the military refuses to obey the commands of civil authority (82). But unlawful military pacifism is hardly the sort of danger we have in mind when we think of military disobedience to a civil authority. The moral importance of preventing unlawful military pacifism pales in comparison to the moral importance of not deliberately killing people who have a right not to be killed.

In chapters 8 and 9 -- which begin the second part of the book -- Fisher discusses the changing nature of warfare and the morally salient characteristics of modern wars, such as the morality of preventive warfare and torture. In this second part of the book, Fisher's background in civil service serves him well. He argues that preventive war is not in principle impermissible; the only morally relevant difference between preventive and preemptive wars is epistemic: assessing a threat is contingently more difficult in preventive wars than in preemptive wars. He also argues that there might be exceptional circumstances in which torture is morally permissible, though he disagrees with Alan Dershowitz's infamous argument that torture should be legal.

Fisher discusses both Gulf Wars in chapter 10, though the bulk of the chapter is devoted to the second war. He suggests that though the war did not have a just cause, the civilian and military leaders ought not to be blamed for believing otherwise. This belief, Fisher argues, was a rational response to the intelligence purporting to show that Hussein's regime was harboring WMDs and was thus violating UN resolutions, thereby providing a just cause for attack.

In attempting to show that their mistaken belief was "not unreasonable" (203), Fisher emphasizes the fact that multiple security agencies from various states reached the same conclusion: that Hussein was stockpiling WMDs. They reached this conclusion, Fisher says, primarily because Hussein acted like he was stockpiling WMDs -- by, for example, cooperating less than fully with UN inspectors. But it was painfully obvious to those with even a rudimentary understanding of Arab culture and politics that for Hussein to allow UN inspectors unfettered access would be a humiliation for him, since it would be interpreted by others as an obsequious submission by a sovereign Arab leader to the will of Western powers. And revealing that he had no WMDs would, in Hussein's mind, diminish his relative domestic and regional political power.

Fisher suggests that this interpretation of Hussein's behavior did not occur to the relevant intelligence agencies until after it became clear that there were no WMDs. He seems to think that because multiple intelligence agencies failed to correctly interpret Hussein's behavior, it was therefore rational to believe that his regime was stockpiling WMDs. But the proper conclusion might just as well be that the relevant intelligence agencies, as well as the civilian leaders who deferred to them, were at best grossly naïve and incompetent.

Fisher categorically denies that the Bush administration used the flawed intelligence as a pretext for an invasion with ulterior aims. In fairness, we cannot expect Fisher, in less than one chapter, to allay all the doubts of those who are inclined to believe that the Bush administration was motivated by a neo-conservative vision of extending American political influence throughout the Mideast. But even setting the bar low, Fisher's reasons for denying this sort of interpretation are unconvincing. Specifically, he argues that the strategic outline for the war in Iraq never included a plan for an extended occupation (204). But it is unclear why Fisher thinks that this is evidence against the claim that the Bush administration's aim was to replace regimes hostile to American interests with friendly ones. After all, it was erroneously thought (as Fisher himself points out) that the Iraqi population would welcome their Western liberators, which is precisely why it was thought that a massive occupational force would be unnecessary.

The relatively apologetic approach Fisher takes in his attenuated aretaic evaluation of the coalition leaders (he suggests that at worst they were guilty of strategic errors, such as failing to prepare for post bellum conditions in Iraq) suggests that all that Virtue Consequentialism requires of them (qua military commanders) is that they abide in good faith by the principles of jus ad bellum. But it would be remarkable if the principle of the just war tradition and an aretaic approach to morality would line up in this way. Wicked or not (and he thinks not), the coalition leaders launched an aggressive war that, by Fisher's own admission, failed to abide by any of the conditions of jus ad bellum; they are responsible for the unjust deaths of a hundred thousand innocents (at least) and the unjustly ruined lives of millions more. Wouldn't Virtue Consequentialism require the leaders to atone by at least resigning from positions of leadership, admitting their mistakes, and publically accepting responsibility for preventing millions of humans from flourishing -- if only to serve as a warning to future leaders and as a lesson for the rest of society? Fisher does not seem to think so. Yet if any account of morality would require something like this, it seems his Virtue Consequentialism would. In the same way that virtue requires more of soldiers than that they merely attempt to abide by jus in bello, virtue requires more of military leaders than that they merely attempt to abide by jus ad bellum.

In chapter 11, Fisher discusses wars of humanitarian intervention; his considerable knowledge of international politics is evident here. Carefully tracking the attitudes and policies shaping the legality of wars of humanitarian intervention over the last two decades, Fisher criticizes the wavering commitment of the international community in general and the UN specifically in authorizing such wars. He argues that infringing upon state sovereignty through the application of military force is morally permissible when the state fails in its responsibility to protect its citizens. Skeptics, however, would want to hear more about the effectiveness of such wars, which is, of course, a condition of jus ad bellum. More than any other part in the book, the chapter on humanitarian intervention will be of interest to just war theorists and laypersons who, in general, will be edified by Fisher's insights into how and why the norms of humanitarian intervention have shifted -- and what policies and decisions determine these norms.

Fisher ends the book with a general discussion of the possibility of waging only just wars. Ultimately, laypersons, philosophers in general, and just war theorists in particular will find the second part of Fisher's book useful.