Morality in a Natural World: Selected Essays in Metaethics

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David Copp, Morality in a Natural World: Selected Essays in Metaethics, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 361pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521863711.
California State University, Chico

Reviewed by Eric Gampel, California State University, Chico


David Copp's new book offers an ambitious defense of a naturalistic variety of moral realism, with an emphasis on showing that a naturalist realist can account for the 'normative' or action-guiding aspect of morality.  Three of the ten chapters are new; the rest are previously published articles.  All of the chapters emphasize metaethical themes, and most either reference or further develop the moral theory the author presented in his 1995 book, Morality, Normativity, and Society.[1]  This new book, like all Copp's work, is clear, systematic, and very carefully argued, with detailed and worthwhile discussions of naturalism, moral realism, normativity, and rationality.

The starting point for Copp's thinking is his sense that we are all moral realists pre-theoretically: we take ourselves to have moral beliefs that can be true or false, and that involve the ascription of moral properties such as goodness, wrongness, and virtue (6).  But Copp argues that, contrary to appearances, the moral properties we ascribe are ultimately naturalistic ones, by which he means "ordinary garden-variety natural properties -- properties that have the same basic metaphysical and epistemological status as the properties a tree can have of being deciduous, and the property a piece of paper can have of being an Australian twenty-dollar bill" (249-250).  In the first chapter, "Why Naturalism", Copp discusses several different accounts of this "basic metaphysical and epistemological status" of natural properties, eventually offering an account on which natural properties are ones "'answerable' to experience" (42).  He follows Hartry Field's formulation of this as allowing that we might reasonably believe a natural property is instantiated even without any empirical evidence, so long as we accept that there could be empirical evidence against the belief (46).  Thus naturalism does not require that each of our moral beliefs is in fact based on experience, only that we grant empirical evidence bears on whether any of our moral beliefs are correct, even our basic ones.  The contrast is with intuitionist non-naturalists, who think basic moral judgments are insulated from such empirical evidence, e.g. G.E. Moore's judgments of intrinsic value, or Kant's Categorical Imperative.

This account of naturalism allows Copp to answer some of the common worries about whether a naturalist can make sense of ordinary moral epistemology (Chapters 2-4).  We don't seem to determine whether pain is intrinsically bad, or cruelty wrong, through empirical observations: we learn our basic moral beliefs and concepts early in life, and as adults rely on them in forming our own moral judgments.  A naturalist might insist that until one has grasped the true nature of moral properties -- as defined by the correct naturalist theory of those properties -- one's moral beliefs wouldn't be justified.  But Copp takes a more plausible path, appealing to a reliabilist epistemology to make sense of how one might have justified moral beliefs without knowing the correct naturalist theory of the truth conditions of those beliefs.  So long as a naturalist can show our ordinary moral belief-forming mechanisms are, for the most part, reliable in leading us to (mostly) true moral beliefs, she can count us as justified.  This strategy also helps Copp explain how a moral proposition could be self-evident: finding a synthetic moral proposition self-evident can also involve a reliable belief forming mechanism, even if the truth of the proposition depends on facts about which one is unaware (107-9).

Copp tackles the challenge of accommodating the normativity of moral thought and discourse by first distinguishing three "grades" of normativity: generic, motivational, and authoritative.  Generic normativity, of the sort shared by morality, etiquette, and aesthetics, Copp defines as an area of discourse being evaluative or proscriptive "in virtue of its semantics, meaning, or content; it is essentially recommendatory or proscriptive" (257).  Motivational normativity Copp takes to be a guarantee that "if a rational person thinks she is morally required to do something, she will be motivated to do it" (258).  Authoritative normativity Copp defines as morality's providing objective and/or overriding reasons for action.  Copp gives detailed and interesting arguments for thinking that naturalist moral realism could account for each kind of normativity, while also maintaining that in fact morality only has generic normativity.  But even generic normativity raises a problem, since the naturalist moral realist takes us to be ascribing natural properties when we make moral claims, and thus describing natural characteristics.  Copp's solution is to offer his own naturalistic moral theory, set forth in Morality, Normativity, and Society, and show that it enables moral discourse to have generic normativity.  On Copp's "society-centered theory", moral properties consist in being related to a norm or standard of action: for instance, "moral wrongness is, roughly, the property of being ruled out by a system of standards the currency of which in the relevant society actually would contribute better than that of any other such system to enabling the society to meet its needs" (267).  Since the natural property of wrongness includes standards proscribing certain activities, those standards are part of the content of moral claims about wrongness.  So on Copp's naturalist theory, morality ends up generically normative: in saying an act is wrong, we are both describing a natural property of the act, and relating the act to standards that proscribe the act.

Is Copp's own society-centered theory suitably naturalist?  Since the theory defines moral properties by reference to the standards that best contribute to meeting a society's needs, the key is to define "best" and "needs" in empirical ways.  Copp spells out needs in terms of such things as ensuring physical integrity, social harmony, and peaceful relationships with neighbors (17), and presumably intends a quantitative measure to determine which set of standards best meets such needs.  This satisfies naturalist strictures, but I worry about whether such laudatory features are properly described as the main 'needs' of societies, and whether such an account of social needs can serve the other purposes Copp requires of it.  Consider, for instance, Copp's explanation of how ordinary persons could have moral knowledge, despite being ignorant of what would make their moral beliefs true.  Appealing to his society-centered theory, Copp suggests that people's moral belief-forming mechanisms, involving largely accepting the moral examples and principles of one's society, have a reliable tendency to track the truth.  Why?  Because

societies do better at coping with their problems, other things being equal, to the extent that their members have true moral beliefs … [and over time] we can expect the societies that are more successful at meeting their needs to thrive (85) 

In other words: societies will tend to teach their members mostly true moral beliefs, and to more closely approximate the truth as time goes by; so in relying on society's teachings I can still hold justified moral beliefs, e.g. about the wrongness of deliberate cruelty.  But this raises obvious problems: why might a society not thrive by ensuring its members hold false moral beliefs, e.g. that no non-members are deserving of moral consideration?  Isn't that precisely how most societies have thrived, perhaps including our own?  Or is it the case that such a moral belief about non-members is, on Copp's view, actually true?  The worry is that to get his truth conditions right, as well as to support the kind of reliabilist epistemology Copp so nicely defends, the account of social needs and actual history have to turn out exactly right.  That empirical story needs more attention than Copp gives it here, though to be fair, Copp's ambition in the book is just to sketch the possibility of such a strategy, rather than to defend it in detail.

An important challenge Copp does directly tackle in the book is to defend his naturalist account against a new version of G.E. Moore's open question argument, offered by Paul Horgan and Mark Timmons.[2]  Moore noted that we can always ask, of something fitting a proposed naturalist definition of 'good', whether it is in fact good.  Most contemporary philosophers take Moore's argument to at most rule out analytic naturalist definitions, ones that seek to capture the meaning of "good", leaving open the strategy of synthetic definition.  If we can synthetically define water as H20, after discovering that H20 is what all our samples have in common, why couldn't we also synthetically define goodness?  Horgan and Timmons try to block such a strategy by asking us to imagine a Moral Twin Earth, where life and moral discourse look mostly the same, but where the term corresponding to our "morally wrong" tracks different natural properties.  They use Richard Boyd's naturalist semantics, which identifies reference with what "causally regulates" the use of the terms: on Earth, the use of "water" is causally regulated by H20.  Horgan and Timmons stipulate that on Earth, we discover moral terms are causally regulated by consequentialist properties, described by a consequentialist theory TC; while on Moral Twin Earth, moral terms are causally regulated by deontological properties, described by a deontological moral theory, TD; everything else is held the same.  What Horgan and Timmons argue is that a naturalist realist would have to take Earthlings to be ascribing consequentialist properties, while the Moral Twin Earthlings ascribe deontological ones, making genuine moral disagreement impossible.  The problem for the naturalist is that we have a robust intuition that we and the Moral Twin Earthlings actually have a shared moral vocabulary, using moral terms in similar ways to regulate and judge behavior, and thus could have a genuine disagreement about what is morally right.

Copp grants the intuition, but argues that a naturalist semantics could have that implication.  In an article reprinted as Chapter 6, Copp seeks to defeat Horgan and Timmons' argument by appealing to Hilary Putnam's semantic theory, rather than Boyd's.  On Putnam's theory, as Copp explicates it, the reference of our kind terms is fixed not simply by a causal relation to usage, but by a combination of our referential intentions, and what our interests define as the "important" similarities amongst samples of the kind.  In the case of water, our referential intention is to "refer to the liquid that has the underlying nature of the local samples", which is an invisible structure consisting (mostly) of H20 molecules (204).  In the case of "morally wrong", Copp suggests that Earthlings intend "to refer to actions that are of the kind or that have the property that the speaker and most speakers in his linguistic community intend to refer to in using 'wrong'".  The same is true, by stipulation, for Moral Twin Earthlings.  In addition, Copp suggests that Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings have the same interests that define the important similarities amongst the samples: "to pick out the kind of action or property of actions, whatever that might be, that is of primary importance morally in deciding which actions to avoid" (224-5).  Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings have different theories about that property: Earthlings take it to be given by TC, while Moral Twin Earthlings take it to be given by TD.  But on Putnam's semantics, those theories do not dictate the reference of the terms -- a society might be radically wrong about the important similarities amongst the samples, as for instance we were in the case of heat when we thought it was a substance we called "caloric".  Copp concludes that on a Putnam-style naturalist semantics, the similarity in referential intentions and interests means that the terms on Earth and Moral Twin Earth would be assigned the same meanings, and Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings could genuinely disagree about what is morally wrong.

Horgan and Timmons responded to Copp's original paper,[3] prompting Copp to write the new essay included as Chapter 7 in the book.  Horgan and Timmons pointed out that Copp left it unclear that Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings actually succeed in referring to any natural properties, as he sets out the scenario.  The referential intentions and interests Copp describes do not guarantee reference to natural kinds: what other speakers intend to refer to, or what is "of primary importance morally", may for all Copp says involve non-natural moral properties.  Horgan and Timmons argue that Copp is stuck with a dilemma: either he specifies the details of the naturalistic relation that fixes reference for moral terms on Earth, in which case "there will be a Twin Earth scenario in which the Moral Twin Earthlings bear the same kinds of relations to distinct natural properties" (Horgan and Timmons, 146), or he leaves the naturalistic relation unspecified, in which case it's indeterminate which natural properties the moral terms pick out (or whether they pick out natural properties at all).

Copp replies in Chapter 7 by grabbing the first horn, appealing to his society-centered theory to spell out the details of the naturalistic account.  Call Copp's society-centered theory TSC, and assume that on Earth, TSC plays the roles Copp thinks it does: most of our moral beliefs fit TSC, accepting the moral teachings of one's parents is a reliable method of approximating to TSC, etc.  Now suppose a Moral Twin Earth, just like ours in most respects, but where TD, not TSC, plays those kinds of roles.  Why doesn't Copp have to conclude that Moral Twin Earthlings are talking about the properties defined by TD, rather than TSC?  Copp's answer, if I understand him, is to insist that the proper scenario to consider is one in which the referential intentions shared by Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings themselves incorporate TSC, thus guaranteeing sameness of meaning and reference.  He writes

The basic idea would be that 'right' is used with the semantic intention of ascribing to an action or a kind of action the property of being required by the code of rules, whatever it is, the currency of which in the society in question would best contribute to the society's ability to meet its needs.  (238) 

Copp then points out that, if Earthlings and Moral Twin Earthlings have the same intention to refer to properties satisfying TSC, there can be genuine moral disagreement.  For instance, if I believe that sacrificing one to save five is morally permissible, for any relevantly similar society, while Moral Twin Earthlings disagree with me, at most one of us is correct, depending on what moral code would best satisfy the needs of the society that includes all of us (239).  That's right, but it seems to require stipulating that his society-centered theory offers an analytic definition, true simply in virtue of our referential intentions.  It's no surprise that an analytic naturalism, where we share meaning with Moral Twin Earthlings, is not going to have trouble making sense of moral disagreement.  The challenge Horgan and Timmons raised was to a synthetic naturalist realism.  In addition, Copp is making a very peculiar supposition: does he really think his society-centered theory is embedded in our referential intentions?  I am uncertain what Copp would say to these worries.

There are many other significant and worthwhile discussions in this book, including an elaboration of how to use speech act theory to stitch together the expressivist and cognitivist elements in moral discourse (Chapter 5), and a highly original discussion of how a theory of rationality might be grounded in a conception of autonomy (Chapter 10).  There is no question that this book is worthy of study for those interested in naturalistic moral realism.

[1] David Copp, Morality, Normativity, Society, Oxford University Press, 1995.

[2] Paul Horgan and Mark Timmons, "Trouble for New Wave Moral Semantics: The 'Open Question Argument' Revived", Philosophical Papers 21 (1992): 153-175.

[3] Terry Horgan and Mark Timmons, "Copping Out on Moral Twin Earth", Synthese 124 (2000): 139-152.