More Kinds of Being: A Further Study of Individuation, Identity, and the Logic of Sortal Terms

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E. J. Lowe, More Kinds of Being: A Further Study of Individuation, Identity, and the Logic of Sortal Terms, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 227pp., $ 99.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781405182560.

Reviewed by Gary S. Rosenkrantz, University of North Carolina, Greensboro



E. J. Lowe is a leading figure in contemporary analytical metaphysics. In many writings over the years, he has developed a neo-Aristotelian system of metaphysics. More Kinds of Being is the second edition of Lowe’s Kinds of Being (1989). In the interim, Lowe developed a four-category ontology inspired by Aristotle’s Categories. According to this ontology, the four basic categories of being are (1) enduring objects (or individual substances), (2) kinds (which are instantiated by enduring objects and which more or less correspond to Aristotle’s secondary substances), (3) attributes (which characterize enduring objects but cannot be said to be instantiated by them), and (4) modes (which are often called tropes by other philosophers).

More Kinds of Being places the ideas from Kinds of Being within the context of Lowe’s four-category ontology and extends those ideas in novel and highly significant ways. The focus is on enduring objects and the kinds they instantiate, including a special emphasis on persons and personhood. Lowe argues that while in some instances objects of one sort are constituted by other objects of a different sort, this is not the case with persons. He further argues that persons differ from many other sorts of things in lacking a criterion of identity over time. Lowe also defends an objectivist account of the laws of nature and dispositional attributes (or causal powers) according to which natural laws and the possession of dispositional attributes integrally involve kinds or universals, and thus, presuppose the existence of such abstract entities. (Not surprisingly, Lowe’s preference is for immanent Aristotelian universals, though he does not undertake to refute the existence of transcendent Platonic universals in the current work.) This leads Lowe to reformulate the principles of first-order logic in a way which enables him to capture the logical relationships between statements of natural laws and statements attributing dispositional attributes to objects.

More Kinds of Being is densely and masterfully argued, written with great clarity, and makes a number of important original contributions to the field. It is certainly essential reading for anyone interested in contemporary analytical metaphysics. This is a metaphysical study of lasting value and significance.

The topics covered in the book can be summarized as follows. Chapter 1 is concerned with introductory preliminaries: (i) the various senses of ‘is’, (ii) Lowe’s general take on the concepts of individuality, kinds, realism, semantic truth, conceptual truth, metaphysical truth, necessary truth, and a priori truth, and (iii) a summary of the metaphysical framework propounded in Lowe’s The Four-Category Ontology: A Metaphysical Foundation for Natural Science (2006). Chapter 2 presents an account of sortal terms, criteria of identity, and the logical connections between them. In Chapter 3, Lowe sets forth and defends his account of individuals, sorts, and instantiation. Chapter 4 explores the metaphysical notions of number, unity, and individuality. Chapter 5 defends the absoluteness of identity. Chapter 6 is an examination of the relationship between identity and constitution. Chapter 7 concerns parts and wholes. Chapter 8 deals with the nature and identity of lumps of matter, living organisms, and persons. Chapter 9 is a defense of Lowe’s view that the proper formulation of natural law-statements presupposes the use of sortal terms. Chapter 10 explores the related topics of plural quantification and sortal reference. In Chapter 11, Lowe discusses the logical relationship between laws and dispositions, and develops a system of first-order sortal logic that can be used to capture this logical relationship. Chapter 12 completes the study by addressing questions about the syntax and semantics of complex sortal terms and the identity criteria of sorts or kinds.

In the remainder of this review, I shall discuss in depth a relatively small number of arguments that I found somewhat questionable (it should be noted that More Kinds of Being is packed with arguments and is generally remarkably persuasive). This discussion will be organized by chapter.

Chapter 2: Sortal Terms and Criteria of Identity

In a passage on p. 13, Lowe writes as follows:

A sufficient, but not necessary, condition for a general term’s being a sortal is that there should exist some principle for counting or enumerating individual instances falling under it. Thus, there are ways of counting the number of men or tables or books in a given room, but no way of counting the number of red things that there are.

Lowe further explains that our inability to count the number of red things that there are is neither a function of our epistemic limitations nor a function of there being infinitely many such things. Rather, this inability is a function of there not being a determinate maximal number of such things. Yet, on p. 171, Lowe readily concedes that we are able in some relatively straightforward sense to count numbers, writing "we should be happy enough to allow that we do not count numbers in precisely the same sense that we may count chairs, although the two senses are obviously very closely related." This concession is vexing because, as Georg Cantor established, there is not a determinate maximal number of numbers, and generalizing from Lowe’s account of our inability to count the number of things falling under the term ‘red’ as a function of there not being a determinate maximal number of things falling under that term, it follows that there does not exist any principle for counting or enumerating individual instances falling under the sortal number. Moreover, on p. 50, Lowe argues that although two quantities of homogeneous and infinitely divisible matter, or “atomless gunk”, would in some possible cases be distinguishable from each other, entities of this sort are not countable. In the light of all of this, further clarification is needed of what Lowe means by a principle of counting or enumeration, as well as of the sense in which he thinks that we count numbers.

Chapter 4: Number, Unity, and Individuality

Unlike the majority of philosophers of mathematics, Lowe is unwilling to accept that zero is a number. On pp. 53-4, Lowe argues that

Taking a single object to be the limiting or degenerate case of a plurality, this allows us to say that every single object possesses the number one. But since the notion of a ‘null’ plurality is a manifest absurdity, we are not committed to the existence of ‘the number nought’.

Lowe is apparently seeking to convince the reader that numbers are fundamentally properties of pluralities — with the number one being an exception. He motivates his argument by arguing that it is unintuitive to think of zero as a number, writing on p. 52 that

Most ordinary folk would consider it at best a bad joke to be told that, say, there is a number of pound notes in a sealed envelope that has just been given to them, when in fact the envelope is empty.

But Lowe gives us little reason to believe that these ordinary folk would be irritated because they do not intuitively accept that zero is a number. Their irritation would most likely have another source. They were led to falsely believe, by a sentence deliberately constructed to be unclear within the context of ordinary discourse, that they were about to receive a plurality of pound notes. The collective noun, number, when preceded by a, is most often used as a plural and the plurality of notes accentuates that plurality. Also note that, suspiciously, the use of the singular is, while essential for Lowe’s purposes, is actually at variance with that ordinary pattern of usage of number. Even mathematicians who do intuitively accept that zero is a number would likely be no less irritated than so-called ordinary folk. Lowe observes that most ordinary folk would not be pacified by being told that zero is a number. But it is likely also true that our mathematicians would not be pacified by being told this. Lowe’s observation hardly shows that ordinary folk [plural noun] do not intuitively accept that zero is a number.

I further counter that, intuitively, numbers are quantitative entities. Moreover, a quantitative entity necessarily pertains to how many there are of something of some sort. For example, “How many socks are in a pair?”, “How many stars are there in our solar-system?”, “How many centaurs are there on the Earth?” My intuitions are that the answer to the first question is two, the answer to the second question is one, and the answer to the third question is zero. Hence, in my view, it is intuitive to think of zero as a number, and thus, zero’s being a number is part of the intuitive data for the ontology of elementary arithmetic. To the extent that such a viewpoint is legitimate, Lowe’s argument that numbers are fundamentally properties of pluralities is unmotivated. (Arguably, numbers are quantitative properties of abstract sets, e.g., the null set in the case of zero.)

Chapter 7: Parts and Wholes

Tibbles the cat minus her tail is known as Tib. It may appear that before Tibbles loses her tail, Tib is a proper part of Tibbles, and hence, is not identical with Tibbles. Yet, it also may appear that after Tibbles loses her tail, Tibbles is identical with Tib. Like Lowe, I am not willing to countenance the possibility of something’s being identical with a certain thing at one time but not at another. Lowe’s interesting solution to this puzzle entails that Tib is a proper part of Tibbles before she loses her tail, and remains so even after Tibbles has lost her tail. It strikes me as odd to say that Tib continues to be a proper part of Tibbles after Tibbles has lost her tail. And if one makes this move, then one must abandon a widely accepted axiom of mereology known as the weak supplementation principle, i.e., if an object has a proper part, then it also has another proper part which is not a proper part of that first part (Lowe’s formulation of the principle). To his credit, Lowe seriously considers, even though in the end he does not accept, an alternative solution according to which there is no such thing as Tib, and hence, Tib is not a part of Tibbles. Such an alternative solution can be supported by arguing that, unlike Tib, any genuine part of Tibbles, e.g., an electron, an atom, a molecule, a cell, an organ, an organ-system, instantiates a sortal that figures in some natural law. According to another related solution, Tib may be identified with a collection, but an individual substance such as Tibbles cannot have a collection as a part. Both of these alternative solutions have the advantage of allowing us to preserve the weak supplementation principle.

Chapter 8: Persons and Their Bodies

On pp. 105-6, Lowe argues that a single atom of gold is not itself golden, and thus, does not count as a bit of gold. More specifically, he argues that something is golden only if it consists of gold, that something consists of gold only if it is composed of smaller bits of gold, and hence, that something is golden only if it is composed of smaller bits of gold. Yet, since a gold atom is composed of non-golden sub-atomic particles such as neutrons, protons, and electrons, Lowe concludes that a gold atom does not count as a bit of gold. Lowe’s conclusion seems to clash with the widely accepted idea that a single atom of an element (e.g., gold) is a minimal sample of the element in question. Moreover, if something is golden only if it is composed of smaller bits of gold, then it is very difficult to understand how any number of non-golden gold atoms can compose a golden object. For instance, in that case, it appears that a piece of matter composed of two gold atoms wouldn’t qualify as a golden object because it too would not be composed of smaller bits of gold. Likewise, for a piece of matter composed of three gold atoms, and so on. If this is right, then the assumption that something is golden only if it is composed of smaller bits of gold leads to the unacceptable conclusion that nothing is golden. For these reasons, it seems prudent to cleave to the widely accepted idea that a single atom of gold is the smallest bit of gold.

Lowe defends the thesis that persons comprise a sui generis kind of individual and argues that human persons are not identical with living organisms on the ground that persons and living organisms do not have the same criterion of identity. Consonant with the aforementioned defense, he argues that ‘person’ is a semantically simple sortal term, and for that reason, is unanalyzable. Note, in this regard, that Lowe defends the general claim that only semantically simple sortal terms designate genuine sorts or kinds; semantically complex ones do not. Although Lowe accepts the Lockean thesis that persons must be capable of action, perception, and reflective thought, he argues that no necessary condition of personhood of this sort can be used to formulate an adequate analysis of personhood. He assumes, quite plausibly I think, that ‘person’ is a sortal or classificatory term. According to one proposed analysis of this sortal term, ‘a is a person’ can be analyzed as ‘a is a thing which can act, perceive, and reflectively think’. Lowe rejects this proposal, arguing that ‘thing’ is not a sortal term, and hence, that the proposed analysis has the unacceptable implication that ‘person’ is not a sortal term. Moreover, he argues that in such a proposed analysis ‘thing’ cannot be replaced with any genuine sortal so as to produce a satisfactory analysis of ‘person’. Lowe reasons that there is a sense in which person is “multiply realizable”, e.g., persons may be material or immaterial or may be embodied in living organisms or non-living robotic machines. However, Lowe doesn’t consider the possibility of replacing ‘thing’ with the term ‘individual substance’. It appears that ‘individual substance’ is a sortal term, since there seems to be a principled way of counting or enumerating the number of entities that fall under that term, and according to Lowe, this is a sufficient condition for ‘individual substance’ qualifying as a sortal term. It might be objected that the term ‘individual substance’ is not a sortal term because it is not associated with a set of persistence conditions expressible by a criterion of identity over time. But Lowe denies that an association of this kind is a necessary condition of a term’s qualifying as a sortal term, and in particular, he holds that ‘person’ is a sortal term that is not associated with such a set of persistence conditions. So, such an objection would be a non-starter. Furthermore, it is very arguably correct that, necessarily, a person is an individual substance (regardless of whether that person is material or immaterial, and regardless of whether that person’s embodiment is biological or cybernetic). Lowe further argues that

any attempt to confer upon something the status of person by trying to ascertain first whether it can act, perceive, and engage in self-reflection is, in any case, going to be implicitly question-begging. This is because positive answers to such questions very arguably already presuppose personhood.

Lowe seeks to bolster the foregoing argument by invoking a holism of the mental according to which

ascriptions of agency, perception, and self-consciousness to a subject cannot be made independently either of each other or of ascriptions to it of indefinitely many other appropriately interrelated psychological states of suitable kinds, such as beliefs, desires, and intentions — states which go together to make up the complex network of phenomena necessary to constitute the mental life of a single person.

I have some doubts about this doctrine of holism. For instance, it appears to me that there are good grounds for believing that there are non-human living organisms which perceive but are not capable of reflective thought or action. Furthermore, it strikes me as possible for a person to lose the capacity to perceive while retaining its capacity for self-consciousness, e.g., as a result of some sort of brain damage or impairment. Indeed, neurological studies are replete with cases of individuals who, due to a specific kind of brain damage or impairment, have lost a particular cognitive capacity without losing other closely related ones. The existence of such cases suggests that an individual may possess various cognitive capacities in virtue of neurological structures located in different regions of the brain that may function independently of one another. It appears that if ascriptions of agency, perception, and reflective consciousness can be made independently of one another, then Lowe has not established that ‘person’ cannot be analyzed, for example, as ‘an individual substance that is capable of action, perception, and reflective thought’.

On p. 138, Lowe argues that a person cannot be instantaneously generated. According to Lowe, the generation of a person must take time because the generation of a person necessarily involves learning processes that take significant periods of time. I was somewhat puzzled by this argument. First, as Lowe intimated on p. 114, although a person must have the capacity to learn a person need not have actually learned anything. Even if learning something necessarily takes time, it appears that someone may be endowed with a capacity to learn something instantaneously.

Chapter 9: Sortal Terms and Natural Laws

A widespread view about the laws of nature is that all such laws are universal and in some fairly strong sense inviolable. However, Lowe argues that there two kinds of laws of nature: (i) those which are exceptionless, such as ‘Protons carry unit positive charge’, and (ii) those which have exceptions, such as ‘Ravens are black’. According to Lowe, the fact that there are white albino ravens is compatible with ‘Ravens are black’ being a natural law. He argues that an albino raven is an abnormal raven and that in principle ‘Ravens are black’ can qualify as a law of nature in virtue of normal ravens being black. Lowe defends the thesis that natural laws set or register certain standards, and that as such, nomicity is a normative characteristic. In his view, such a normative characteristic is a function of the properties that a normal exemplar of a sort or kind can be expected to possess. Lowe defines a normal crow as a crow that conforms to all natural laws about crows. Such a normative conception of normality differs from a statistical conception of normality in that a normative conception of this kind is consistent with the possibility that abnormal crows outnumber normal crows.

Lowe suggests that exceptionless natural laws typically apply only to theoretical entities, e.g., protons. But it seems that there are many paradigm cases of laws — e.g., concerning gravity, motion, and temperature — that are exceptionless and apply to all material things, regardless of whether these things are theoretical or observable. Moreover, I was not persuaded of the correctness of Lowe’s claim that there are natural laws which have exceptions in addition to those that are exceptionless. Lowe attempts to justify this claim by appealing to the example ‘Ravens are black’. It is not obvious that there are comparable examples of non-biological sortals that he might have appealed to instead, e.g., natural laws about water are about pure samples of water and presumably are exceptionless. Lowe observes that biological references to the raven-species are not made in reference to a natural kind, and in particular, are not made in reference to the universal which Lowe calls the raven-kind. Rather, such biological references are made in reference to a particular concrete community or population of living organisms which has a certain lineage. It follows that given Lowe’s theory of natural laws, biology itself is not committed to ‘Ravens are black’ being a natural law. Nevertheless, consonant with his view of natural laws, Lowe believes that there are natural laws about the universal raven-kind. But evolutionary theory in biology entails that the color of exemplars of the universal raven-kind is a relatively incidental and superficial characteristic of such creatures that is subject to change due to mutation and natural selection. Accordingly, the color of exemplars of the universal raven-kind is not unlikely to vary in virtue of environmental conditions which are local and transitory, for instance, the occurrence of ice ages. Hence, there is no good reason to expect normal instances of the universal raven-kind (in either a statistical sense of normalcy or in Lowe’s normative sense) to be black independently of when or where they happen to exist, e.g., during an ice-age on Earth, or on a snowy planet in a distant galaxy causally isolated from Earth.

It appears that if, like Lowe, we think of the raven-kind as a genuine natural kind, then we should accept that living residents of such a distant planet which are structurally identical with earthly ravens in the relevant respects are also ravens. Although Lowe argues that a law such as ‘Ravens are black’ would be replaced by the law ‘Ravens are white’ if the norm for ravens were to evolve in the requisite way due to changes in environmental conditions and natural selection, this move does not appear to adequately address concerns about the possibility of distant planets where ravens are predominately white due to environmental conditions and natural selection. After all, such possible scenarios need not involve evolutionary color-changes of the aforementioned sort. In the light of the foregoing considerations, I am not prepared to accept Lowe’s argument that empirical generalizations like ‘Ravens are black’ qualify as natural laws. I do believe that in the current epoch, the universal raven-kind tends to have instances on Earth that are black; however, there being such a tendency does not entail that it is a natural law that ravens are black.