Music, Philosophy, and Modernity

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Andrew Bowie, Music, Philosophy, and Modernity, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 428pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521877343.

Reviewed by James Currie, University at Buffalo


No doubt, I will digress and my language will be excessive, exaggerated, and too full of song. I apologize in advance; I am a musician and we do like to make things sing. However, the question to which I will, ultimately, be directing my attention, is whether there is any point in turning up music's volume in a place such as a book review which, strictly speaking, isn't meant for music. Andrew Bowie quotes a lovely passage from Schleiermacher that seems relevant here: "Song is the indifference of speech, crying, and laughing. Each of these can approach song, but none of them becomes song without ceasing to be what it is" (p. 159). Either the presence of music in my prose will debilitate it from performing the job at hand, or it will just momentarily drown out the philosophy which will inevitably, of its own accord, later float to the surface and then have to be identified and addressed, dissected and passed judgment upon. Indeed, except that in this instance the body that will end up on the slab (Bowie's formidable Music, Philosophy, and Modernity) is itself, of course, full of music. Admittedly, Bowie's own language is almost completely free of any trace of the excesses that both characterize my own prose and which I am prepared, tentatively, to call music -- a point and problem to which I will return later. But its apparent sobriety nevertheless articulates a call for philosophy to address music, and, further (something potentially quite shocking) that music should not merely be philosophy's object of investigation since music, as it were, knows something that much Anglo-American philosophy, in particular, as yet does not. As Adorno writes: "We do not understand music -- it understands us. This is as true for the musician as for the layman. When we think ourselves closest to it, it speaks to us and waits sad-eyed for us to answer."[1] Or Bowie's words: "One possibility is to regard the 'philosophy of music,' not as the philosophy whose job is conceptually to determine the object 'music,' but rather as the philosophy that emerges from music" (p. 11).

Of course, for many within the more recognizable Anglo-American traditions, the study of music within the discipline of philosophy will seem like a rather charming distraction. If one is humorously indulgent of continental quirks and practices (and, indeed, the love of philosophy for music is a predominantly continental habit), one might view music’s relation to philosophy as analogous to that of the mistress to the married man. (As the nineteenth-century novel attests, continentals have always been more fluent in translating extra-marital transgressions into normative conventions.) After all, music is often scripted either as a woman (Wagner), or as dangerous (St. Augustine), or even as both (the seminal myth here being that of the sirens). Nevertheless, although she may be the source of some of our most touching moments, that doesn't protect her from the fact that, in general, she is often deemed expendable. For the mistress, at least in the stock of clichés from which I'm drawing, doesn't work; she takes part neither in the earning of money, nor in the labor of reproducing the already existent moral and ethical structures of the social, which is traditionally the job of men and the family. And philosophy, of course, does claim to do work. Of course, feminist critics have been quick to argue against such assumptions. They have asserted that the mistress, particularly in the form of the courtesan, was absolutely central to the labor of social reproduction, and so have urged that, as an appropriate political act of disenchantment, we should cut the euphemisms and name things as they are -- hence the term sex worker. So what then is the work that music in philosophic society performs? Again, what does music know?

In an earlier book, Bowie, with his characteristic succinctness and disdain for hysterics, had posed a question that suggested that music, in fact, works very hard indeed: "If all we are can be stated in words, why does our being also need to be articulated in music, as every known culture seems to suggest?"[2] One might start to answer Bowie's question by performing the following experiment, which I frequently use when teaching: playing a piece of instrumental music (for example, the famous first prelude in c major from book 1 of J. S. Bach's Well-Tempered Clavier) and then asking "what does it mean?" Sometimes (and often rather bizarrely) a student will give a detailed narrative response (of an old woman reminiscing about her life as she walks through a forest on a warm summer's evening, or some such). More often, students respond by listing their emotional reactions. Whatever the nature of the answers, though, what is nearly always to be noted is the infectious enthusiasm that the question in relationship to the music produces; the activity itself of being involved in answering seems meaningful to them. However, as the answers continue to tumble out of music's horn of plenty, the evidently meaningful nature of the activity per se comes into an increasingly contradictory relationship to the terms seemingly set up by the question itself. For one could be forgiven for assuming that pleasure in relationship to answering the question would come from answering it succinctly: What does it mean? It means x. And yet as the list of answers continues to swell, the possibility of establishing x fades. So music confronts us with the paradox that specific meaning is not a precondition for an activity being meaningful (full of meaning). Even if a student answers (smartly) from the other side of the question and asserts that music doesn't mean anything, the subsequent line of inquiry still leads us to a certain paradox. For even if it does not mean anything, music still is something; it is not an illusion, even if the location of its status as thing can involve us in torturous convolutions. And yet if using basic music theoretical terminology one were to start articulating the properties of this thing (in the Bach, for example, every two beats there are eight notes that arpeggiate one harmonic sonority, and so on), one's articulation would, in a frustrating way, always be lacking; only the grimmest of formalists would deny this point. So with music, language is either too tumescent or impotent, gloriously in excess of its goal, or frustratingly unable to reach it.

In Bowie's book, one of the primary pieces of work that music performs is to make available this knowledge: that there are places where things still work but where language (or at least a certain understanding of it) fails, or exceeds its limits. Tautologically, then, one might say that what music (and Bowie's own work on music) reveals is music -- as opposed to what we might refer to as "music as …" (for example, music as language). Viewed at this angle, Bowie's work could be placed in the context of work in both musicology and philosophy over the past decade that has sought, in the face of overly culturally determinative postmodern interpretive practices, to urge reconsideration of the notion of musical autonomy. In particular, one might mention here the work of Lydia Goehr, Berthold Hoeckner, and Martin Scherzinger. However, Bowie doesn't engage extensively with this work. Scherzinger's work, for example, doesn't occur at all -- which is a shame, since the dialogue, I feel, would be productive. Like these thinkers, Bowie is indeed wary of structures of understanding that pin music down too tightly (to language, culture, meaning, and the like), but that is less important to him since he is concerned with the autonomy of music as an object -- something which is always, by contrast, an important political and ethical move in Scherzinger's work, even though it is not always necessarily its goal. After all, one of Bowie's opening moves in the book is to critique and distance himself from the analytic tradition of philosophy beginning with Frege, Russell, and early Wittgenstein, and thus from the "idea that one can demarcate the forms of language which reliably connect with the world from those which do not, and can therefore employ the former to define meaning" (p. 5). Bowie is exceedingly wary of the subject-object distinction underlying the analytic tradition, precisely because he feels that insistence upon it fatefully limits what can be seen as productively constituting meaning. Although the

founders of the analytic tradition increased the precision of some kinds of argument and got rid of certain confusions regarding the logical status of a number of issues in philosophy … they did so at the expense of restricting the scope of what was considered worthy of, or even amenable to, philosophical attention. (p. 7)

Rather, Bowie seems primarily concerned with the autonomy of music as an activity, something that he would like to see philosophy itself aspire to: "the practice of philosophy itself is also part of what it is to be human, which, like music, may play a world-disclosive role" (p. 45). Music is thus meaningful because in its specificity it does something that perhaps only music qua music, specifically, can do. It is, in part, because of this, that it can teach philosophy something and thus transform it, rather than philosophy remaining invariant as a practice which then knows music. Music is therefore an agent, not just an echo. As a musicologist -- and thus part of a discipline that continues to justify itself through the forging of allegiances with other more big-fisted disciplines in the university play ground (these days cultural studies, not so long ago mathematics) -- I find this incredibly liberating and empowering. For this reader, it is one of the finest contributions made by Bowie's impressive study.

In its strategic distancing from subject-object relations, then, Bowie's work holds strong affiliations with contemporary pragmatism. But this creates a two-way shock. Let me explain. As with many other books of Bowie's, Music, Philosophy, and Modernity is structured around a sequence of chapters that covers in roughly chronological order key moments within the history of continental (and almost exclusively German) philosophy during modernity -- starting with Herder and the question of language in the late eighteenth century, and then passing through Kant and Schlegel, Hegel, German Romanticism, Schelling and Nietzsche, Wagner and Schopenhauer, Wittgenstein and Heidegger, Adorno, and then concluding. Admittedly, this book is no mere historical survey, even though an increased sensitivity to historical context, which philosophy often fails to achieve, is one of Bowie's aims. Philosophers appear both historically and also more ahistorically: Adorno appears in the chapter on Wagner, Heidegger in the context of Herder; similarly issues in today's contemporary philosophical debates also intervene; the question of the work of music qua music pervades. The effect and intention is thus quite constellatory. Nevertheless, this "tradition" (with the exception in varying degrees of Nietzsche, Wittgenstein, and Heidegger) is one that most contemporary pragmatic thought often distances itself from, because of its assumed metaphysical pretentions. Further, one usually would rarely consider, as Bowie does, thinkers such as Adorno or the German Romantics as having a pragmatic streak.

In part, Bowie's aim is simply to show that there are connections that habitual partisanships within philosophy have worked to obscure. But in doing so, he actually performs the very kind of work that he claims music itself does. For Bowie's Music, Philosophy, and Modernity project is directed by a particular set of ethical values that he derives most obviously, though not solely, from the modern German hermeneutic tradition. Thus, by means of his critique of the analytic tradition, he seeks to move beyond "the world being seen 'atomistically,' as a series of discrete objects," so as to move towards seeing it "'holistically,' as an interconnected web, in which what things are also depends on how we speak about them and act in relation to them and to each other" (p. 7). Music, of course, has a key role to play in the activation of this essentially hermeneutic cycling process of world-disclosure in which mine and thine begin to interpenetrate and open up into each other -- as, for example, when contemporary pragmatics comes to an understanding of itself in German continental philosophy, and vice versa. These privileged opportunities for opening up that are afforded by music are a response to, in Martha Nussbaum's words, "our urgent need for and attachment to things outside ourselves that we do not control" (p. 34). More importantly, historically this need becomes particularly acute for Bowie in the vertiginous condition of modernity where the auratic force of sovereignty and religion have waned, with the resultant effect that, to quote Marx's famous line from the Communist Manifesto, "all that is solid melts into air." As with contemporary pragmatists like Rorty and also hermeneutics, Bowie is thus primarily concerned with the social justification of actions; similarly, he seeks to encourage the proliferation of conversations, if we conceive these broadly as anything that brings us into productive relationships with the world and others. He is interested in forms of "comprehensibility" that derive from "ways of coping with the world that transcend particular languages"; concerned with understanding "the power which music has to connect us to the world in many differing ways" (p. 148); consistent in his belief that there "are indefinitely many kinds of response to the world, from painting to dance, and so on, which can be appropriate in the right context" (p. 122). It is important for him to remind us repeatedly that "music matters because of the way it connects to, articulates, and evokes aspects of life which would not be accessible without the music itself and its immediate effects on its listeners" (p. 123). This particular ethical theme finds its final, and perhaps most moving, illustration in the book's conclusion in a discussion of the East-West Divan founded by Daniel Barenboim and Edward Said in 1999. The orchestra was conceived precisely so musicians from Israel and other Middle Eastern countries could play together. Here the act of musical performance itself -- another important theme in Bowie's book -- allows for the opening up and disclosing of a certain space usually obscured by the seemingly insurmountable political antagonisms cutting across the lines of communication and understanding in those troubled parts of the world.

Keeping this all in mind, it will not be surprising to note the tone of disapproval that Bowie adopts when confronted, particularly in the work of Adorno, with hyperbole or anything verging on the crudely exaggerated. Indeed, this tone has been a constant in Bowie's work for some time. Take the following:

It may be that Dialectic of Enlightenment makes intentionally exaggerated claims, given [Adorno and Horkheimer's] despair at people's failure to grasp what is happening in the world at the time. This is, though, unlikely to be an effective rhetorical ploy. People tend to dismiss even valid points if they are made in an exaggerated manner.[3]

For Bowie, exaggeration inhibits opening up; it is socially distasteful, lacking in proper consideration, and thus encourages the Other to clam up and close off the lines of potentially productive disclosure. Bowie's response to exaggeration is, to his credit, consistent with his own ethics, and thus he resists the exaggerated and uncommunicative act of rejection. His tendency, rather, is to show how other aspects of the writer's work might be more profitable. And so, again, Bowie promotes lines of communication and exposure being kept active -- for example, to those in more mainstream Anglo-American philosophy who have traditionally tended to indulge in the unproductive marginalization of the philosophy whose merits Bowie so patiently and carefully extols. This, one might say, characterizes the particular music of Bowie's prose. However, I would like to move towards concluding by suggesting (paradoxically perhaps) that it is precisely in these seemingly most generous of critical moves that Bowie is, in fact, most closed and censorious. After all, since the body of German philosophy that Bowie defends is so frequently characterized by what appears to be exaggeration (that is its music, as it were), then maybe we should consider exaggeration as deliberate rather than a mere character flaw. As is attested, particularly in his engagements with Nietzsche, Bowie is far from being insensitive to such strategic and potentially performative aspects of philosophical prose. However, it is a limited sensibility and this results in places, in my opinion, in readings that seem more like rather neutralizing acts of translation -- as if we were being offered a German philosophy without the German philosophy, like coffee without the caffeine, to steal an oft-repeated joke of Žižek's. My point here is not necessarily to reject Bowie's ultimate ethical goals. Rather, it is to suggest that something  excessive either may be needed in order to attain them, or is already present yet presently masked in the act of their attainment -- a something other that potentially the German philosophy of modernity understands and can offer. I will examine this in terms of Adorno.

Bowie's desire for the kinds of world-disclosive acts that are made available by music is, in part, motivated by a horror of deadlock, and in this sense there is a powerful resonance between him and Adorno. For Bowie, however, Adorno becomes his own object of critique when, as has been frequently noted by Adorno's detractors, the supersubtle dialectical movement of Adorno's thought is interrupted by seemingly crude and intransigent totalising generalizations, for example, concerning the culture industry, or bourgeois society as a closed system of disharmony, or the untruth of the whole, or the truth of dissonant music, and so on. So Bowie seeks to draw our attention to the texts which are not marred by these blots, such as, in Bowie's opinion, the Mahler essay. His, as it were, act of redemption (and I use the phrase cautiously here), is to give us an Adorno without his symptom -- without that which seems to inhibit Adorno from being the Adorno Adorno would seem to be claiming to want to be. We should note the underlying therapeutic process here and, having done so, remember what the late Lacan concluded from a lifetime of clinical observation regarding the symptom: that the attempt to remove the patient's symptom often results in an exacerbation of the very problem (i.e., the deadlock) that the symptom supposedly creates; the conclusion being that what one must do is to identify with the symptom, rather than (as Bowie seeks for Adorno) making the patient continue in the commitment to overcoming it. As I believe is often the case, Adorno would probably have concurred with Lacan; after all, he writes: "In psycho-analysis nothing is true except the exaggerations."[4]

Read too cursorily, my readers will assume that I propound indulgence in the worst of our second nature. That would be incorrect. What I seek to draw attention to is the repression contained in philosophical discourse whose clarity masks from itself its own potential complicity with such second nature -- and I would assert that this is, in places, the case with Bowie's work as it is also of one of Bowie's own objects of critique, analytic philosophy. For what the vulgar intransigence of the Adornian blot and the late Lacanian symptom attest to is the inherently traumatic nature of the paradox of subjection within modernity; the degree to which, truly, we have been stamped, and the pain that comes from the almost near impossibility in being able to see beyond these interpolations to that which has interpolated us -- in short, suffering.[5] These blots then are the markers of what we might refer to as a necessary impossibility constitutive of these texts' own successful performance of their themes and content. For Adorno's diagnosis of the modern world -- which, along with Robert Hullot-Kentor,[6] I believe to be just as relevant today, particularly in the US, as it was when Adorno was writing -- is that there is a fundamental incommensurability in place between the universal (the traumatizing nature of ever-adaptable late capitalism) and the particular (for example, our day-to-day activities as academics writing books about music, philosophy, and modernity). Tautologically speaking, then, in order to get through the day, we have to perform as if we were just getting through the day. Ideological machinery merely supports us in our desire to believe that that is all we're trying to do, and that our life, therefore, is no performance at all, but rather the thing itself. However, as Lacan famously writes regarding foreclosure, "whatever is refused in the symbolic order … reappears in the real,"[7] and so the repressed but determining universal constantly intervenes through us during the course of our day in the form of delusional projections: for example, as road rage, or racism, homophobia, paranoia, and so on. The Adornian blot is merely an attempt to transform such delusional projections into forms of knowledge for the subject -- and in this regard, Adorno remains a philosopher of the Enlightenment.

However, Adorno does not, as many of his detractors would assert, merely want to give us up to this traumatic knowledge, for that would, to follow through on the Lacanian theme, merely be to indulge in a sacrifice resulting in psychoses. (The truth of this is given by the high degree of schizophrenia and related diseases in those who are, as it were, overly exposed to the real of this trauma: i.e., the destitute.) Rather, he seeks to find ways of living (or rather writing) that split. The blots are, thus, the necessary but impossible attempt to see the situation from the outside, whilst remaining, as one must, within our activities on the inside. We are dealing here with the Hegelian dialectic of universal and particular. The quality of vulgar exaggeration that hangs around these blots is on the one hand a performative enactment of the impossibility of fully knowing from the position of one's activities what Fredric Jameson might refer to as the "absent cause" of our subjection. On the other hand, the blots are a means of making it felt that there is, in fact, a mode of production cutting across (nicely put, mediating) the minutiae of our world and all the worlds that, through our activities such as music, we disclose. It is a means of letting us feel and be wounded by an understanding of the threat of the frightening degree to which that fact might come to determine us (here Bowie's thoughts on feeling and music might be employed for a more productive way of reading Adorno's prose). Without this dissonance, this exaggeration, what tends to happen is that we all nod in concerned agreement at the articulation of atrocities, but the structure of our thought remains comfortably inured. (I thoroughly disagree with Bowie on this point; niceness is neutralizing in this instance.) But to take the undeniable crisis of our present situation seriously, crisis must already be understood to be reverberating in, and as part of, the very structure of philosophical discourse itself. This is why Adorno asserts that dialectics "will not come to rest in itself, as if it were total. This is its form of hope."[8]

As Bowie frequently argues, it is only through our activities (such as music, or thinking) that the world can be disclosed to us and we can enter into it. Adorno would agree, but with the proviso that those activities are in some sense cut across (antagonistically, as it were) by what they must deny in order to function as activities in the first place. On the one hand, as Adorno puts it in Negative Dialectics, thought (as an activity) "is driven to it [this inclusion of the traumatic universal] by its own insufficiency, by my guilt of what I am thinking."[9] On the other hand, thought (as an activity) must do this in the name of happiness, which for Adorno essentially amounts to thought's authentic movement, its music, as it were. Thought without the necessary but impossible knowledge encapsulated in the Adornian blot is merely a going-through-the-motions. In Adorno's words: "Knowledge has no light but that shed on the world by redemption: all else is reconstruction, mere technique."[10] Mere technique ultimately results in what Cornel West calls "diseases of the soul," the deadlock of depression. And so I would suggest that the paradox that Bowie doesn't quite appreciate about modernity -- and which Adorno and, I propose, much of German philosophy does -- is that in order for there to be movement, there has to be something that, seemingly, does not move. To hear the music of "yes" which comes when something is truly opened up, we must, first of all have insisted upon "no." As Žižek might say, there is a necessity for a certain violence.

[1] Theodor W. Adorno, Beethoven: The Philosophy of Music, edited Rolf Tiedemann, translated Edmund Jephcott (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1998), xi.

[2] Bowie, Aesthetics and Subjectivity: From Kant to Nietzsche, second edition (Manchester: Manchester University Press, 2003), 3.

[3] Andrew Bowie, Introduction to German Philosophy: From Kant to Habermas (Cambridge: Polity, 2003), 238.

[4] Adorno, Minima Moralia, translated E.F.N. Jephcott (London and New York: Verso, 1978), 49.

[5] For inroads into the paradoxes of subjection see Judith Butler, The Psychic Life of Power: Theories in Subjection (Stanford, California: Stanford University Press, 1997).

[6] For example, see Robert Hullot-Kentor, Things Beyond Resemblance: Collected Essays on Theodor W. Adorno (New York: Columbia University Press, 2006), 2-3.

[7] Jacques Lacan, The Seminar, Book III: The Psychoses (1955-56), translated Russell Grigg, notes by Russell Grigg (London: Routledge, 1993), 13.

[8] Adorno, Negative Dialectics, translated E. B. Ashton (New York and London: Continuum, 1973), 406.

[9] Adorno, Negative Dialectics, translated E. B. Ashton (New York and London: Continuum, 1973), 5.

[10] Adorno, Minima Moralia, 247