Musical Concerns: Essays in Philosophy of Music

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Jerrold Levinson, Musical Concerns: Essays in Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2015, 173pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199669660.

Reviewed by Theodore Gracyk, Minnesota State University Moorhead


Jerrold Levinson's new book gathers together eight recent papers on philosophy of music, an older co-authored paper on the nature of the temporal arts, and three previously unpublished essays about music. Because it is a slim book unified only by the topic of music, there is an unfortunate possibility that it will be overlooked by everyone except philosophers of music. However, Levinson has written so many important essays in aesthetics and his reputation is so secure -- he is well established as one of our leading philosophers of art -- that any new book from him merits attention. But that is not the only reason I hope this collection finds its way to a broader audience. There are two distinct groups who will especially profit from reading it. First, for those who possess a philosophical interest in music (or art generally) but know nothing of Levinson's contributions to these topics, it is an ideal entry point into his established œuvre. Second, there is a good deal here for those of us at the opposite pole, who've followed his work for decades, as he pauses to reconsider and update his past claims about musical value and meaning. In particular, it is refreshing to find multiple essays discussing songs and singing instead of composed works in the classical tradition.

The value for newcomers to Levinson's work -- or even newcomers to philosophy of music or to philosophy of art -- is that it is organized so that the initial chapters consist of clear, straightforward exposition of his views on the nature of music appreciation, the value of music, and the nature of musical works. Accessibility is facilitated by the fact that several of the essays were written or commissioned for appearance in journals or books that required Levinson to provide an introductory overview of the focal topic (e.g., "Musical Beauty" and "Values of Music"). Others take stock of important debates that his work has precipitated. For example, he has produced only one monograph about music, Music in the Moment (Cornell University Press, 1997). Musical Concerns offers us an excellent précis of that monograph in "Concatenationism, Architectonicism, and the Appreciation of Music." Levinson lays out concatenationism (the view that moment-to-moment listening is what matters most in music appreciation) and its rival, architectonicism (the view that conscious awareness of large-scale form is essential in the appreciation of many works), and addresses the main points of contention between the two camps. (Although Levinson is responding to Peter Kivy's 2001 criticisms of that book's thesis and argument, it is not necessary to read any of this background material in order to benefit from this essay.) Elsewhere, "The Aesthetic Appreciation of Music" offers, in 15 pages, a consolidation of all that Levinson has previously said on the topic, while "Indication, Abstraction, and Individuation" is an admirably clear articulation of his important and highly original contribution to the ontology of music and literature.

For those who already know Levinson's work, especially his significant contributions to philosophy of music, the volume's appeal is twofold. First, it contains several essays commissioned for publications that are likely to pass under the radar of philosophers (e.g., "Values of Music" appeared in the Handbook of the Economics of Art and Culture). Second, there are the three essays that are previously unpublished: "Shame in General and Shame in Music," "Instrumentation and Improvisation," and "The Expressive Specificity of Jazz." The last of this group is a particularly strong essay, extending his established views on musical expressiveness in new ways. Bundling it with two other essays on jazz and one on improvisation, Musical Concerns has the additional attraction that a third of the contents focus on jazz, evenly divided between issues in instrumental jazz and in jazz singing.

Although Levinson's Introduction describes the opening chapter ("Philosophy and Music") as "a light note" in the collection, it is better described as the overture that introduces several recurring and unifying themes. In a minimum of space, Levinson articulates his view that good music typically offers hedonic value, the pleasure of appreciative listening, but it also offers cognitive and moral value. Music offers "compelling visions of human reality" and so possesses great practical value in affording, readily and invitingly, "instruments to ethical reflection and self-knowledge." (13) Most of the subsequent essays return to this theme, elaborating upon it to a greater or lesser degree. Most importantly, the chapter "Musical Beauty" and the essays on jazz singing make it clear that Levinson's aim is to demonstrate that these values are frequently conjoined, and inseparable, in attentive listening -- that is, in aesthetic attention, "directed to an object's form and content." (21) In his view, almost all music has some amount of symbolic content. I find Levinson vague about the frequency with which good music is pure in the sense that it lacks relevant "human content" and works to "captivate us through their melodic-harmonic form alone" (63). Nonetheless, he holds that, typically, the properly appreciative point of view attends to the way in which musical form creates the impression of agency and so generates music's expressiveness. Non-expressive aesthetic qualities are also "important," but Levinson's most frequent theme is that the supervening "content at the level of gesture and expression" is the normal, and most important, object of interest in appreciative listening (25). Normally, appreciation requires a "readiness to register and respond to [music's] expressive dimension, to be alive to its human content and not simply a passive admirer of its formal design or technical ingenuity" (20). Generally, the content supervenes effortlessly upon the form: "attentive and suitably backgrounded listeners" grasp the supervenience of content upon form "readily and spontaneously." (97) (The contribution of the essay on shame in music is a consideration of cases where expressiveness is present but not so readily heard.)

In combination, two of the essays provide a particularly rich exploration of the manner in which a specific kind of music will facilitate a specific range of expressiveness, thereby offering a specific vision of human flourishing. "Musical Beauty" addresses the possibility that a particular aesthetic property, beauty, facilitates a valuable content that is lacking in music that is not beautiful, no matter how expressively powerful. "The Expressive Specificity of Jazz" explains how the combination of certain musical features (e.g., those which allow us to hear, spontaneously, that a piece of otherwise unfamiliar music is jazz) will both facilitate and restrict the expressive specificity of a particular musical idiom.

Methodologically, Levinson may be criticized for being inconsistent when arguments depend on empirical claims. He cites empirical studies when it is in his interest to do so. Observing that "the empirical has a way of trumping the logical" (p. 41), he cites research in the psychology of music that favors the doctrine of concatenationism, thus trumping empirical claims made by other philosophers about the relative importance of listening for global structures of music (pp. 41-43). However, Levinson sometimes builds his own arguments on generalizations that are likely to fail a similar test in a controlled experiment. As a case in point, the argument of "Popular Song as Moral Microcosm" holds that repeated exposure to music of admirable "ethical quality" will have at least some positive effect on listeners: "in fact it is difficult to believe that repeated exposure to music that is ethically superior . . . should have as a rule no effect on character at all" (p. 117). But the level of Levinson's credulity is not a firm foundation for any argument. I, in response, find it very easy to believe that repeated exposure to such music has no effect on character. (I admit to being influenced by Frank Zappa's response to a United States Senate inquiry into violent and "immoral" music: "There are more love songs than anything else. If songs could make you do something we'd all love one another.") Since believability is no measure of truth, philosophers should defer to the best available empirical research. On this matter, I can locate some evidence that music alone may have some positive effect on shaping character, but no evidence that popular song does so.

Finally, Levinson could do more to work out the implications of several of his most important claims. For example, I have noted that the essay on shame makes the important concession that "readily" heard expressive qualities may be supplemented, in a correct interpretation by a "suitably backgrounded listener," by recognition of qualities that the listener "does not readily or spontaneously" hear. (97) Yet it is difficult to determine just what background Levinson expects the listener to possess. It must be more than just the internalization of stylistic norms. His position on artistic indication, so neatly explained in "Indication, Abstraction, and Individuation," holds that work individuation (and thus legitimate appreciative response) ultimately "rest[s] on the unique identity of the artist . . . in a specific creative context." (51) As such, one of Levinson's major examples in "Musical Beauty" merits scrutiny. Contrasting the musically pretty with the musically beautiful, Levinson offers the beauty of Chopin's nocturnes in contrast to the "merely pretty" ones composed by John Field, which were the immediate model for Chopin's compositions. This contrast calls attention to the creative context, but makes nothing special of it.

Five pages later, Levinson asserts that some degree of novelty is required "in the music's evolution" if it is to be beautiful and not merely pretty and that to recognize novelty we must attend "beyond the bounds of what one would normally consider a structural feature of music." (64) However, Field is more novel than Chopin with respect to nocturnes. He invented the type; there were, practically speaking, no nocturnes until Field published a work with that title in 1812. More importantly, many of their contemporaries held that Field's nocturnes were more beautiful than Chopin's, whose own novelty here was the comparative crudeness of his expression. But as Levinson says in one of the jazz chapters, "musical expressiveness resides in the invitation that music extends to a listener to hear it as expression in the primary sense." (135). In this spirit, I am not raising the issue of whether we trust Levinson's critical judgment rather than that of Chopin's peers in this particular example. My point is that Levinson may be discounting the degree to which listeners are misled by what they spontaneously hear. If novelty is relative to creative context, and beauty is (in part) a matter of novelty, then it might often be the case that readily hearing a composer's music as dull -- as opposed to novel and beautiful -- or readily hearing it as more or less coarse in its gestures will prove to be a response to an invitation never sent. I should think that Levinson's position requires that, the more remote we listeners are in time and place from the composer's creative community, the less likely we are to readily hear what is there by virtue of the fact that the work is an indicated structure, with all that that entails.

Levinson raises the stakes on this point in "Values of Music" when he acknowledges non-aesthetic artistic values and then issues a promissory note that he will, in forthcoming work, explain how originality, influence, and other artistic values are "grounded in valuable appreciative experiences that they make possible." (76) He raises the stakes again when he asserts that expressivity is "the most important part of [music's] symbolic content." (80) I wonder how often and in just what sense that is true. Consider the concluding paragraph of Levinson's essay on concatenationism, where he offers a comment on Adorno's discussion of the subway rider whistling a tune from Brahms's First Symphony. Adorno's point, I take it, is that the theme, as a mere bit of melody with a determinate expressive quality, is symbolically enriched by its presence in that location in that symphony. However, to hear that, one must hear the symphony as Brahms's creative solution to the alleged death of the symphony and hear Brahms's repurposing of Beethoven as central to that symbolic gesture. In focusing on the hedonic value of the isolated expressive fragment, Adorno's man in the subway does not attend to any of that and cares nothing about the valuable appreciative experience that Brahms has invited us to explore.

In putting Chopin above Field, and then again in defending the man in the subway against Adorno, I worry that Levinson does not want to pursue the full implications of a theory of appreciation in which attentive and suitably backgrounded listeners are listening to the invitation that was actually issued from within a specific creative context. In some contexts, some of the time, musicians (both collectively and individually) may employ musical gestures to model (and comment upon) complex social structures, so that music's expressiveness is a mere means to another symbolic end. Even if a music lover does not readily and spontaneously hear it, it may be a more frequent occurrence than Levinson acknowledges.