Musical Understandings: and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Music

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Stephen Davies, Musical Understandings: and Other Essays on the Philosophy of Music, Oxford University Press, 2011, 221pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199608775.

Reviewed by Paul Thom, The University of Sydney


This collection of reprinted and reworked essays is loosely organised around the concept of musical understanding. The first four chapters focus on musical expression, the next six on various things that can be meant by speaking of understanding music, then there are two chapters on ontological questions, and a final chapter on musical profundity. This is a fairly wide spread of topics, and the level of organisation falls short of what would be needed in a book designed to be read from beginning to end. At the same time, anyone who reads it from beginning to end will find a lot of very good up-to-date philosophy of music, which also includes a certain amount of undesirable repetition, especially in the opening chapters.

The opening chapters ('Artistic expression and the hard case of pure music', 'Music and metaphor', 'Cross-cultural musical expressiveness: theory and the empirical program', and 'Emotional contagion from music to listener') are devoted to a defence of the theory that music's expressiveness is due to its power to give rise to responses based on similarities between the music's expressive properties and certain naturally expressive human behaviour. As the author says, 'The concept of musical sadness, for instance, is the concept of the music's disposition to produce the listener's recognition of sadness under appropriate conditions of listening' (32).

Some readers might take this talk of the listener's recognition of sadness to refer to an emotional response in the listener that mirrors the quality of sadness expressed by the music. However, that is not what Davies means. He allows that there are mirroring experiences and he does not think these are necessarily pathological, but he doesn't think they are necessary for the occurrence of the required recognition. All that is required is that the listener experience the resemblance that the music bears to certain expressions of sadness: 'So much for the dependence, what of the response? What form does it take when what is experienced is music's expressiveness? I believe it is an experience of resemblance between music and the realm of human emotion' (9). And the resembled items in the realm of human emotion are not inner feelings but external behaviours: 'music is expressive in recalling the gait, attitude, air, carriage, posture, and comportment of the human body' (10).

This suggests that the listener's response to expressive music (leaving aside the case where the listener feels a mirroring emotion) is simply a matter of perception, as in other cases of response-dependence. Yet this consequence would place the listener's response to music's expressiveness in a different category from the listener's response to musical form, which according to Davies is an experiential one in a sense of experience that is contrasted with mere perception: 'Music appears to have an experiential rather than a discursive logic. We do not merely perceive a succession of patterns in music. Instead, we experience the musical parts as connected into a dynamic whole' (75). But why should it be that the listener's experience of musical expressiveness can be merely a perceptual matter, while the listener's experience of musical form cannot?

Davies distinguishes listening from mere hearing on the ground that the former unlike the latter is 'attentional' -- this being the important case for the philosophy of music. But one might wonder whether it is also important to draw distinctions within the attentive listening to music. One may attend to specific sorts of things in the music because one is listening for things of that sort -- the music's formal features, or the ways in which it is like the expression of human feelings. And one may attend in different ways -- in a closely analytical way, or with a kind of absorption that leaves no room for analysis.

These opening chapters focus on factual questions about whether a given musical passage expresses a given state or feeling, not on evaluative questions about how well it does so. Yet music-lovers do raise such evaluative questions, and sometimes, at least, they accord higher esteem to a passage because it communicates how something feels, rather than simply conveying what it resembles.

In the chapter 'Musical meaning in a broader perspective' (co-authored with Constantijn Koopman), the authors introduce a notion of experiential formal meaning and contrast understanding in response to music with understanding through analysis. This chapter makes a useful distinction between relations of implication and relations of reference within a piece of music.

The essay from which the collection takes its title ('Musical understandings') is an extended piece, exploring different ways in which listeners, performers, music analysts and composers are said to have an understanding of music. Included among these ways of understanding are: recognising the music's boundaries, its determinative instructions for performance, its genre and history, and distinguishing the music from its performance. The chapter gives critical consideration to Levinson on listening in the moment, Raffman on ineffability, DeBellis on expert and inexpert listening, and various other philosophers of music.

In the chapter titled 'The experience of music' Davies opposes the suggestion that music can convey ineffable truths, while allowing that the experience is indescribably rich in its specificity. He considers different genres of listening (listening to the music of the past, to live or recorded music).

There is a fine chapter ('Così's canon quartet') on the vocal quartet in Mozart's Così fan tutte, and certain other moments in the Mozart/Da Ponte operas where time seems to stand still and the characters for a moment stand back from the action. Adopting the approach of a musico-dramatic critic rather than that of an analytic philosopher, Davies argues that at these moments Mozart is pointing to the dramatic significance of the work's underlying musical structures. The approach in most of the book is that of analytic philosophy, and accordingly Davies mostly concentrates on 'pure' music, i.e., excluding vocal music. The exclusion of vocal music from most of this collection stands in sharp relief against its sensitive and original treatment in this chapter. We may hope that one day Davies will write at length about the under-discussed topics of opera and voice.

The chapter 'Perceiving melodies' is a psychological study comparing the perception of melodies with the visual recognition of objects. Davies argues that, just as we can identify the same object presented in different visual circumstances, so we can identify the same musical material when it is presented backwards or upside-down -- noting, however, that such judgments of melodic identity are tolerant to variations in intervallic sequence, and that this tolerance plays an essential role in much musical composition.

In 'Musical colors and timbral sonicism' Davies delivers a thorough-going critique of Julian Dodd's timbral sonicism -- a view according to which the ontology of musical works is to be judged solely on the basis of what their performance would sound like. Davies rejects this as a general theory (here he does not restrict consideration to non-vocal music). Drawing on research in the psychology of perception, he argues that it is not just the quality of the sounds, but also their source, that is constitutive for many musical works. Importantly, he also avails himself here of his own account of musical works, which allows that some musical works are comparatively 'thin' -- noting that such 'thinness' may take the form of not specifying which instruments are to be used in performing the work.

Another chapter ('Versions of musical works and literary translations') elucidates the concept of a version of a musical work, distinguishing versions from drafts, from novel works, from performance interpretations, and from transcriptions. Davies also distinguishes versions of a completed work from versions that complete an otherwise uncompleted work.

The closing essay ('Profundity in instrumental music') combines the author's skills in philosophical and musical analysis to argue for the thesis that some music is profound by reason of the human qualities of insight, vitality, complexity, creativity, flexibility and analytical far-reachingness which it exemplifies. He illustrates the thesis by a musical analysis of the coda of the first movement of Beethoven's Eroica Symphony -- an analysis that convincingly explains why the coda is of such extraordinary length and why the harmonic uniformity of its last 64 measures conveys a sense of apotheosis and triumph rather than one of banality.

The virtues for which Stephen Davies' writings on the philosophy of music are well-known -- his clarity of thought and comprehensiveness of scholarship, his engagement with the psychological as well as the philosophical literature, his grasp of musicological scholarship, and his familiarity with some forms of non-Western music -- are all evident in this volume. Together, they make this volume a very desirable one for senior undergraduate or graduate students who want to know the current state of philosophical debate on the issues covered.