My Way: Essays on Moral Responsibility

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Fischer, John Martin, My Way: Essays on Moral Responsibility, Oxford University Press, 2006, 260pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195179552.

Reviewed by Ishtiyaque Haji, University of Calgary


Moral responsibility has a number of requirements including a control (or freedom), an "authenticity" (or ownership), and an epistemic requirement. The twelve highly insightful and commandingly influential essays in My Way largely address one or more aspects of the first two requirements. The introductory essay is new; the remaining eleven, common currency in the free will literature, have been reprinted with or without minor changes. The fourth and ninth are co-authored, the former with Mark Ravizza, the latter with Eleonore Stump. Rather than give a chapter-by-chapter summary, it will be more helpful to articulate the work's central themes.

A champion of compatibilism, Fischer accepts the conclusion of the Consequence Argument that determinism is incompatible with two-way or regulative control. But he argues that responsibility does not presuppose this species of control largely (though not exclusively) by invoking Frankfurt examples. Responsibility, he proposes, demands only one-way guidance control that can be exemplified in the actual sequence of events culminating in conduct; actions, omissions, and their consequences are symmetric in not requiring alternative possibilities for responsibility. Fischer argues, in addition, against the view that causal determinism in the actual sequence directly--that is, quite apart from expunging alternatives--undermines responsibility. The conclusion of this stream of reasoning is that responsibility can be safeguarded against what some have taken to be the most serious of determinism's threat to it: "genuine" alternatives are non-existent in a determined world.

Fischer seeks to deflect two other alleged threats of determinism to responsibility. One "direct" argument for incompatibilism invokes some version of a transfer of non-responsibility principle. Letting p and q be variables that range over propositions, and taking 'NR(p)' to abbreviate 'p and no one is (now), or ever has been morally responsible for the fact that p,' one incarnation of this principle says that if NR(p), and NR(if p, then q), then NR(q). If determinism is true, the non-relational facts of the past and the laws entail all present and future truths. But owing to no one's being responsible for the past and the laws, and no one's being responsible for its being the case that the past and the laws entail all future events, it follows from an application of the transfer principle that no one is ever morally responsible for one's behavior. The argument is direct because, if sound, it secures the incompatibility of determinism and responsibility independently of any premise to the effect that responsibility requires alternative possibilities. Fischer, though, rejects this argument by producing counterexamples against various versions of the transfer principle. These examples are, roughly, Frankfurt cases involving simultaneous overdetermination. So, for instance, Betty may well be morally responsible for destroying an enemy camp at a certain time, but even without her scheming, an avalanche for which no one is responsible would still have destroyed the camp at that time.

A second direct argument draws on the thought that a person is responsible for something only if he is an ultimate originator of that thing. This condition attempts to capture the idea that if our actions originate in sources, such as the distant past and the natural laws, over which we lack any sort of control, then we are not responsible for these actions. In response, Fischer proposes that there are compatibilist and incompatibilist notions of ultimate origination. He argues that it is not obvious that moral responsibility requires a conception of origination that involves causal indeterminism, especially if one renounces the thesis that responsibility presupposes regulative control.

It is one thing to argue for responsibility's requiring only one-way guidance control, quite another to develop and defend a substantive account of such control. Rising to the task, Fischer (and his co-author Ravizza) propose that guidance control has two components, neither of which determinism impugns. A distinction is presupposed between the kind of "mechanism"--roughly, the type of process--that actually causally issues in the agent's behavior and other sorts of mechanism. The reasons-responsiveness component requires that the mechanism that produces the action be appropriately sensitive to reasons. The ownership component requires that the mechanism be the agent's own. Briefly put, an agent has guidance control in performing an action if and only if the action issues from his own, moderately reasons-responsive mechanism.

Moderate reasons-responsiveness consists in regular reasons-receptivity, and at least weak reasons-reactivity, of the actual-sequence mechanism that leads to action. Reasons-receptivity is the capacity to recognize the reasons that exist, and reasons-reactivity is the capacity to translate reasons into choices (and subsequent behavior). Regular reasons-receptivity involves an understandable pattern of actual and hypothetical reasons-receptivity. A mechanism of the agent that issues in the agent's performing some action in the actual world is weakly reasons-reactive if there is some possible world with the same laws in which a mechanism of this very kind is operative in the agent, there is sufficient reason to do otherwise, the agent recognizes this reason, and the agent does otherwise for this reason.

It is possible for an agent's actions to issue from a moderately reasons-responsive mechanism whose primary constituents have been induced externally by clandestine manipulation, hypnosis, brainwashing, and so forth. Intuitively, in cases of this sort the agent is not morally responsible for the pertinent actions. Such cases impel Fischer and Ravizza to theorize that the way in which the agent's springs of action are acquired has a pronounced bearing on responsibility; responsibility is, consequently, an essentially "historical" phenomenon. Fischer and Ravizza's prognosis is that in these troubling cases, the mechanism that issues in action is not the "agent's own", the agent having failed to take responsibility for it. Reasons sensitivity, thus, requires supplementation with the mechanism-ownership component to guard against causal springs being acquired in a manner that subverts responsibility.

Taking responsibility, measures by which an agent makes a mechanism "his own", involves three elements: the agent must regard himself as the source of consequences in the world by realizing that his choices have effects in the world; the agent must see himself as an appropriate candidate for morally reactive attitudes as a result of how he affects the world; and these beliefs about himself must be based on his evidence in an appropriate way.

The account of guidance control of actions is extended to guidance control of intentional omissions and the upshots of actions or omissions. Moral responsibility for all these items is, thus, "tied together by a unified deep theory" (17).

Recently, it has been argued that determinism undermines the truth of other pivotal moral judgments such as that of deontic judgments involving moral obligation, right, and wrong. One such argument that I have developed starts with the "ought" implies "can" principle: if one morally ought to [ought not to] do something, then one can do [can refrain from doing] that thing; and the principle: if it is morally wrong for one to do something, then one morally ought not to do it. These principles entail that if it is wrong for one to do something, then one can refrain from doing it. So there is a requirement of alternative possibilities for wrongness. The argument can be extended to show that there is such a requirement for obligation and rightness as well. As determinism effaces alternative possibilities, determinism threatens the truth of deontic judgments. Fischer submits that it would render his semicompatibilism--the view that determinism is incompatible with regulative control but compatible with responsibility--considerably less interesting if determinism undermined other moral appraisals such as deontic ones. Thus, Fischer challenges the sort of argument that I have sketched. He claims that various Frankfurt examples involving omissions give us reason to jettison the "ought" implies "can" principle. Suppose that in one instance of this sort of case, Sally fails to raise her hand, thereby ensuring that a child is not rescued from impending disaster. Sally is blameworthy for this omission even though, given her circumstances, she could not have raised her hand. Fischer reasons that since Sally is morally blameworthy for not raising her hand, "she acted wrongly in failing to raise her hand, and thus that she ought to have raised it" (25). But as she could not have raised it, "ought" does not imply "can."

On various "libertarian" accounts, metaphysically available alternative possibilities, or at least the assumption of such availability, are required for practical reasoning and deliberation. Skeptical of such accounts, Fischer proposes that the point of practical reasoning is not to make a difference in the sense of selecting from available alternatives, but to figure out what one has reason to do, all things considered. A rational agent wants to ensure that her choices conform to her all-things-considered-best judgment concerning what she should choose or do. Such an agent would still have this sort of aim even if she were aware that she lived in a causally determined world in which alternative possibilities were unavailable.

Finally, Fischer inquires into why we value morally responsible action. He proposes that when an agent exhibits guidance control and is thus morally responsible for his conduct, he need not be understood to be making a difference to the world; so the value of moral responsibility cannot be the value of making a difference. Rather, Fischer ventures that we conceive of the value of responsibility somewhat in the fashion in which we conceive of the value of artistic self-expression. Just as an artist's creative activity has value because, in engaging in such activity, he expresses himself in a certain way--the artist does or need not make a difference but he does make a statement--so the distinctive value in acting in such a way as to be morally responsible lies in a certain sort of self-expression. Fischer contends that life has a narrative structure in that "the meanings and values of the parts of our lives are affected by their narrative relationships with other parts of our lives, and the welfare value of our lives as a whole are not simple additive functions of the values of the parts" (116). In this sense, our lives are stories. In performing an action for which we are morally responsible, "we can be understood as writing a sentence in the book of our life" (116).

The essays in this volume, together with Fischer's other pieces, have played a major role in shaping the contemporary debate in the metaphysics of free will. Whether or not one ultimately agrees with the relevant positions that Fischer defends, one can ill afford to ignore the wealth of wisdom in the story of responsibility that Fischer carefully crafts. I confine critical attention to two of its elements.

Fischer concedes too much when he claims that his semicompatibilism would be far less engaging if determinism undermined other central moral assessments such as deontic ones. After all, the conditions of satisfaction for the truth of one species of moral judgment need not coincide with those of another species. Further, Fischer attempts to insulate the integrity of deontic judgments against determinism by appealing to the premise that if a person (like Sally) is morally blameworthy for an action, then it is morally wrong for her to perform that action. If one accepts this premise, and if determinism undermines wrongness, then determinism undermines blameworthiness. But I have argued that this premise is false. Blameworthiness requires not that an agent do wrong but that she perform an action on the basis of the belief that she is doing wrong in performing it.

What Fischer offers on the value of moral responsibility is both intriguing and puzzling. First, there is the rich ambiguity of the terms 'value' and 'valuable.' In their most fundamental senses, to value something is to be favorably disposed toward it, and something is valuable if it is good--if it is worthy of being something toward which one is favorably disposed. But it seems that this is not the sense of 'value' or of 'valuable' at issue. With free action, for instance, one might propose in response to why such action is valuable (in the strict sense) that it is intrinsically good. Fischer suggests another sense of 'value' which is more apt, given the context. He says that when an agent exhibits guidance control and is, hence, morally responsible, "it is unattractive to think that the explanation of his moral responsibility--the intuitive reason why we hold him morally responsible--is that he makes a difference to the world. Rather…he expresses himself in a certain way" (114). The proposal is that the sense of 'value' at issue is associated with an intuitive explanation of why the person is morally responsible when she is so responsible. Elaborating, Fischer writes:

[S]ome of the debates about whether alternative possibilities are required for moral responsibility may at some level be fueled by different intuitive pictures of moral responsibility. It may be that the proponents of the regulative control model are implicitly in the grip of the "making-a-difference" picture, whereas the proponents of the guidance control model are implicitly accepting the self-expression picture…. [P]resenting the self-expression picture can be helpful for the following reason. The debates about whether alternative possibilities are required for moral responsibility have issued in what some might consider stalemates; …I do not know of any decisive arguments (employing Frankfurt-type examples) for the conclusion that only guidance control, and not regulative control, is required for moral responsibility. My suggestion is that if one finds the self-expression picture of moral responsibility more compelling than the making-a-difference picture, then this should incline one toward the conclusion that guidance control exhausts the freedom-relevant component of moral responsibility. (119)

On this estimation of the significance of the self-expression picture, it is not transparent why the value of guidance control is tied to narrative value. Part of what it is to have narrative value, Fischer submits, is that the overall welfare value of one's life is not merely a function of adding up all the momentary levels of well-being. Suppose that one does not (as I do not) renounce "additiveness." Assuming that there are "atoms" of well-being, basic intrinsic value states whose sum in a life exhausts the welfare value of the life for the person who lives that life, why could it not be that self-expression is still tied in some fashion to the agent's "writing sentences" in the story of his life? Second, would shifting the focus of the debate on whether responsibility does in fact require alternative possibilities to the intuitive pictures to which Fischer calls our attention help to break the stalemate between the relevant rivals? I have my doubts. If the value of guidance control is analogous to that of artistic self-expression, one would expect libertarians to plump for the position that artistic creativity, including genuine artistic self-expression, presupposes the falsity of determinism; either such creativity or self-expression requires the sort of authorship or ultimate origination that determinism precludes or it requires indeterministic causation of the constellation of behavior constitutive of such creativity or self-expression.