Myths of the Underworld Journey: Plato, Aristophanes and the 'Orphic' Gold Tablets

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Radcliffe G. Edmonds III, Myths of the Underworld Journey: Plato, Aristophanes and the 'Orphic' Gold Tablets, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 288pp, $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521834341.

Reviewed by Stephen Halliwell, University of St. Andrews


There are, au fond, two ways of conceiving of death, one in terms of loss and finality, the other in those of a new beginning or of entry to another world. Both conceptions found their place in the cultural psychology of ancient Greece. Radcliffe Edmonds' book, which is primarily a contribution to the history of Greek myth and religion but should interest Platonic philosophers to the extent that they identify Plato himself as a religious thinker, examines three contrasting Greek manifestations of the idea of death as a journey to a new life. Edmonds deals first, and at greatest length, with the gold lamellae found in a number of ancient Greek graves (often placed on the chest of the deceased) and envisaging, or bearing instructions for, the journey of the dead in the realm beyond. He then tackles Aristophanes' comic reworking of the mythic motifs of a descent (katabasis) to Hades in the Frogs, before shifting gear again to address the myth of the soul's postmortem experiences in Plato's Phaedo. Edmonds brings to bear on all three versions of the underworld journey a tripartite analytic schema of 'obstacles' (barriers or dangers relating to entry to the other world), 'solutions' (overcoming the barriers), and 'results' (the ultimate destiny of the dead). His overarching aim, expounded in his introductory and concluding chapters, is to understand Greek mythic discourse as the constantly evolving medium of a competition for cultural authority. Myths accumulate traditional powers of resonance and persuasiveness, but they effectively exist, Edmonds insists, only in their individual tellings. He therefore eschews grand synthesising theories and focuses instead on the authorial choices that structure particular presentations of myth into specific narrative form. The resulting arguments are always interesting and frequently enlightening, even if there is inevitably scope for disagreement at the levels of both detail and principle.

The funerary gold leaves or 'tablets' which form the subject of Edmonds' long second chapter have been found in Greek tombs from various parts of Italy, Thessaly, and Crete; they date mostly from between the fourth and second centuries BC. Edmonds himself is aware of some tension between his general approach to myth-telling and the nature of this body of material, since the texts are mostly short, rather cryptic, and constructed from variants on seemingly formulaic types. Reading them for 'authorial' choices of narrative form is therefore challenging, not least because of the obscurity of what counts as authorship in this setting: on p. 33, for instance, Edmonds regards the deceased first as the 'primary audience', then as possibly 'involved in the authorship', of the inscriptions (perhaps even as having written them down before death, he later speculates, p. 236). We might wonder, as Edmonds himself does only at the very end of the chapter (108-9), how securely we can infer 'personal beliefs' from the contents of the lamellae. Nonetheless Edmonds sets about reconstructing the otherwordly hopes of those with whom these texts were buried. He rejects, however, any monolithic explanation of the gold leaves by reference to a uniform religious background, whether Orphic (a still greatly contested concept), Dionysiac, or Pythagorean, though he admits the (possible) relevance of each of these categories to some cases. In particular he sceptically resists attempts to find in the tablets traces of the myth, undoubtedly important for later Orphic thinking, of the Titans' dismemberment of Dionysus Zagreus (and the consequent 'guilt' of the human race, born from the ashes of the destroyed Titans: see esp. 58-9, 72-3). He is also rather averse to, but not entirely dismissive of, hypotheses about a connection between the gold leaves and ritual, whether funerary or initiatory (104-8). Instead, he argues that what is crucial is the anticipation of the deceased's self-identification as the possessor of a marked status, whether that is expressed in terms of purity, divine lineage, release from a 'penalty', or something else. The heart of the matter, he contends, is not so much a definitive eschatology (the ultimate rewards are often 'frustratingly vague', 83) as the laying claim to a new identity and 'life', one which is to be understood as sharply at odds with the hierarchies of the social world which the dead leave behind. Edmonds places some weight, accordingly, on the fact that several of the tombs in question are those of women (65-9).

The gold lamellae have been the subject of some highly specialised scholarship. Edmonds is abreast of this work, although he dissents, as already indicated, from its overriding concern with tracing the texts back to specific religious organisations or movements. His treatment of the texts surveys many of the main interpretative issues with both clarity and vigour, providing an account that will be helpful to a wider readership. (It would have been more helpful still if he had supplied a full text and translation in an appendix). Perhaps unsurprisingly, however, given the allusive difficulty of the documents, Edmonds is sometimes more cogent when finding fault with other scholars' over-confident views than when piecing together his own. He tellingly remarks on more than one occasion that earlier disputes over the religious implications of the gold leaves have tended to reflect modern (but frequently undeclared) presuppositions about differences between 'spirituality' and 'ritual', religion and magic, and so forth (see esp. 37-40, 103). But Edmonds' own historical model of the funerary texts as produced for individuals/groups who were socially 'marginal' (e.g. 43, 70, 82) and in search of 'compens[ation] for their unsatisfactory status within the social order' (70, cf. 82) lacks any compelling evidence and is based on some questionable premises.

It is one thing to claim, correctly, that the expectations (or aspirations) carried by the tablets represent something distinct from mainstream Greek polis-centred religious cult. But it is quite another to turn everyone who chose (if they always did -- how can we know even that?) to be buried with such a text into a participant in a 'counterculture' (e.g. 41, 43) that reflected exclusion from, or low standing within, the prevailing social structure. So much about the sources and uses of the gold leaves is unknown; Edmonds never really gives substance to his goal of understanding 'the particular contexts that produced these texts' (83, cf. 30). It is therefore no more than conjecture that the texts expressed a 'protest' (e.g. 30, 41, 68) against the structures of contemporary society. Nor is this even a wholly plausible conjecture, given the signs of affluence that accompany at least some of the burials (a point Edmonds never addresses). With only a flicker of hesitation (69), Edmonds locks his argument into too rigid a paradigm of an oppositional relationship between esoteric religious affiliations and the broader lives of their adherents. But membership in some kinds of separate religious groups could coexist with involvement in more 'mainstream' forms of Greek religion, and still more with full participation in communal life. Edmonds' 'protest' thesis is, on the available evidence, overblown. Its underlying weakness is that it equates religious with social marginality, and by doing so slips into a simplification of the nature of (Greek) religion itself. When, in his conclusion, Edmonds generalises his position into the proposition that 'Orphic texts appeal to the margins of society' (231), one is left wondering how he can square this claim with the image at Plato Republic 364b ff. (a passage cited more than once in this book) of 'Orphic' figures who take their special teachings, with some success, 'to the doors of the rich'.

In his chapter on Aristophanes' Frogs, Edmonds again sets out to combat much existing scholarship, in this case by maintaining -- convincingly, in my view -- that the play's katabasis plot does not follow the supposed rite de passage pattern (separation, liminality, reintegration) of an initiation ritual. Rather, he suggests, it comically evokes and manipulates a whole host of underworld journey motifs -- clustering, once more, around the obstacle-solution-results schema -- in a manner which is both 'carnivalesque' but also expressive of a vision of how contemporary Athens (in deep military and social crisis, facing imminent defeat in the Peloponnesian war) might be refashioned and 'saved'. As well as creating constant confusion about the relationship between the worlds of the living and dead, Aristophanes uses the contrast between the happy and unhappy dead to redefine what makes good/bad Athenians and thus to project onto Hades an image of an idealised Athens, whose reinvigoration is symbolised by the motif (itself rooted in traditional conceptions of the afterlife of 'the blessed') of perpetual festivity.

Edmonds' reading of Frogs contains a wealth of stimulating detail that I cannot engage with here, and is far more alert than much other criticism of the play to the disorientating effects of Dionysus's character ('an undignified buffoon', 116). But it is also very much in line with the dominant trend of recent anglophone Aristophanic scholarship in its compulsion to find deep significance beneath the comic surface. Edmonds speaks repeatedly, and too portentously for my liking, of Aristophanes 'renegotiating' or 'redefining' the boundaries of his society (e.g. 112, 121, 137, 141), though what this boils down to is not much more than the well-known passages where the play either scurillously attacks contemporary 'degenerates' (staple fare for the genre) or, in the famous parabasis (which may be echoing or advertising current sentiment rather than giving original 'advice', as Edmonds supposes), calls for the reenfranchisement of aristocratic Athenian exiles to help save the city in its time of need. Frogs, for sure, allows us to detect, behind the sounds and sights of its absurdities, something of the mood of angst and foreboding that seems to have gripped Athens in the final years of the war. But does the play offer anything more than a ludicrous dream-world of 'salvation'? Can a katabasis to bring back a dead tragedian yield an intelligible redefinition of social boundaries? In a sense, my reservations about Edmonds' thesis are here just as much to do with problems of 'authorship' and meaning as they were in the case of the funerary gold leaves. The difference is that where, with the latter, we have no way of defining authorship, with Aristophanes we face the difficulty of converting extravagantly comic authorship (providing material for staging during 'the moment of flux provided by the Dionysiac festival', 229) into coherent social meaning.

Edmonds completes his triptych of underworld journeys with a perspective on the Phaedo that demonstrates in detail how Plato 'co-opts' the traditions of Greek eschatological myth for a new philosophical purpose. Staunchly (and rightly) refusing to accept any simple, let alone reductive, model of the relationship between Platonic myth and argument in the dialogues, Edmonds contends that the Phaedo deliberately exploits the inherited richness of images and motifs relating to the theme of an underworld journey, but at the same time tries to re-channel the power of the tradition in a new direction. Thus, in the first place, the idea of a problematic, delayed passage from the world of the living to that of the dead for certain categories of person (the unburied, untimely dead, or those who had died violently) is used to create symbolism for the prime obstacle to a good 'philosophical' death, namely attachment to the 'prison' of the body. Correspondingly, the practice of philosophy, which is also the 'practice of/for death', replaces actual funerary rites as the solution to the obstacle that impedes the transition from life to death; ritual purity is superseded by a kind of noetic purity of mind; and the notion of a soul's wandering off the true path to its postmorten destination is reapplied to attachment to the multiplicity of the phenomenal world, so as to clarify the superiority of the knowledge-grounded philosophical life before as well as after death. To enrich his presentation of the philosophical life as a key to a happy destiny in death, Plato assimilates that life to all three traditional means of winning a favourable lot in the afterlife -- heroism (the Socrates of Phaedo is, in part, a new Theseus, Heracles, and Odysseus), virtue, and initiation.

While Edmonds' account of the Phaedo's myth does not add anything radically novel to interpretation of the dialogue, it does provide an illuminatingly full appraisal of just how deeply immersed Plato was in the resources and imagery of mythological eschatology. What's more, many of the points pursued by Edmonds illustrate threads of connection between the Phaedo's myth and the preceding parts of the dialogue, thereby bearing out the author's statement of the need to avoid foisting an oversharp muthos/logos dichotomy onto Plato's writing. Anyone who wants to refine their appreciation of how the Phaedo as a whole engages with earlier Greek ideas of life and death will be able to learn from Edmonds' chapter. My one disappointment, however, is that while adopting such a sophisticated approach to the intricacies of Platonic mythopoeia, and after acknowledging the 'many levels' on which the dialogues can be read (161-2), Edmonds tends to lapse into a rather narrowly conventional view of what constitutes the Phaedo's 'communication between the absent author … and his audience' (161), talking repeatedly of arguments, reasons, and convictions espoused by Socrates in the work as though they could be straightforwardly identified as Plato's own (he can even speak of 'Plato's theories [sic] of punishment', 217 n. 177) and as though its philosophical conclusions were never in doubt. But this seems to underestimate the dramatic complexity and subtlety of the Phaedo, in which, for all his eloquence and fervour, Socrates never decisively convinces his companions to share his attitude to death. Moreover, Edmonds himself takes all (Greek) myth to be intrinsically and densely 'polyvalent'. He consequently finds himself maintaining that in the Phaedo Plato wants both to utilise and to restrict that polyvalence (167-70), though he admits that, if so, he failed in the second of those aims (171). It would, I submit, be hermeneutically more realistic to say of Platonic myth (and of its relationship to philosophical dialogue) something on the lines of what Socrates says of the esoteric doctrine of the body as a 'prison' at Phaedo 62b: that it is 'far-reaching (megas) but far from transparent (ou rhadios diidein)'. Since the object of analysis of a Platonic dialogue cannot properly be the author's 'personal beliefs', a principle conceded here with rather characteristic belatedness (220, the last page of the chapter), it is a pity that Edmonds was not able to incorporate his highly instructive treatment of mythological patterns into a reading of Phaedo that sees 'polyvalence' as more of a source of philosophical fertility, and less of a threat to be controlled and restricted.

This is an enterprising, enjoyable, and scholarly book. There is a sprinkling of mostly minor misprints and errors in Greek, and one or two small historical slips. Edmonds' extensive treatment of the gold funerary lamellae should help to make those puzzling but fascinating texts better known, and his discussions of both the Frogs and the Phaedo deserve close attention from anyone seriously interested in those very different yet mythologically related works. Edmonds' arguments are always informative and thought-provoking, even where they prompt disagreement.