In Defense of Moral Luck: Why Luck Often Affects Praiseworthiness and Blameworthiness

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Robert J. Hartman, In Defense of Moral Luck: Why Luck Often Affects Praiseworthiness and Blameworthiness, Routledge, 2017, 152pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138293441.


Reviewed by Steven D. Hales, Bloomsburg University


The central thesis of this book is a traditional one: that there are kinds of resultant, circumstantial, and constitutive luck that help determine a person's praiseworthiness and blameworthiness (p. 90). In other words, moral luck is a real thing and matters for moral assessment. Of course, this idea has been picked at from various quarters ever since 1971, and there is a lot of material to review and rebut. Robert J. Hartman's book is packed with argument, and he seems to have read -- and determined to respond to -- the entirety of the moral luck literature. The plus side is that anyone with some interest in moral luck will find a discussion of their corner of the debate. There is something for everyone.

Hartman argues (p. 24) that critics who reject moral luck because it relies on a generally inadequate account of "luck" are missing the point. Thomas Nagel and Bernard Williams aimed to use "moral luck" loosely, just to delimit the sorts of conflicts in ordinary moral thought to which they wanted to draw attention. All we need is an account of luck that picks out moral luck; it is a mistake to demand an account of luck that captures all of our common uses of the word.

It's easy to see Hartman's motivation here, but it is misguided. Try his move in other fields. Epistemology: "I'm just giving an account of a priori knowledge here, not trying to give a broader analysis of 'knowledge'. So your counterexamples involving the a posteriori won't work against me, because I'm talking about a priori knowledge, not knowledge in general." Nobody's going to buy that. A priori knowledge is a kind of knowledge, and if an author's treatment of knowledge has big holes in it, no one will say, "oh well, it works fine for the a priori so that's good enough." Physics: "How can you not see that my physics is only meant to apply within an inertial reference frame? Don't be coming to me with all these other frames of reference and pretending that they are counterexamples to my view." Einstein's not going to hang his head in shame and walk away after that rebuttal. The control theory of luck may work for moral luck, but moral luck is a kind of luck. If the control theory has big holes in it, we shouldn't say "oh well, the control theory works for moral luck, so that's good enough".

Hartman also suggests that if people aren't happy with the expression "moral luck" then we can just start "replacing luck with lack of control in our moral luck discourse" (p. 31). That's not likely to be successful, and here's why. What does it mean to be in control of some event or outcome? If I'm playing tennis and my topspin forehand is really working today, it's reasonable to say that I'm in control of my forehand. If I try to hit a forehand, then it's very likely that I will successfully hit it in. In other words, control is a matter of probable success. Alternatively, if I try to hit a forehand, it would be somewhat difficult for me to spray it wide. In other words, control is a matter of modally robust success. Therefore, a lack of control over an outcome X would mean that bringing about X is improbable, or accomplishing X is modally fragile. As Hartman well knows, the other two main theories of luck are the ideas that a lucky event is an improbable one, or a lucky event is a modally fragile one. And Hartman concedes in Chapter 2 that the probability and modal theories won't work for moral luck. In sum: moral luck requires the control theory of luck and precludes all others. The control theory reduces to either the modal or the probability theory. Therefore the control theory will not work for moral luck. Concomitantly, just talking about "lack of control" instead of "moral luck" won't work, since it reduces to concepts incompatible with moral luck phenomena.

The biggest threat moral luck poses is that it threatens to reduce all moral responsibility to zero. Nagel knew this in first bringing up the topic. Hartman spends all of Chapter 3 closely examining Neil Levy's argument for this skeptical conclusion, his so-called 'Pincer Argument'. According to Levy, every morally significant act results either from a person's innate character (which was a matter of constitutive luck) or from the arbitrary circumstances of the moment (which are also a matter of luck). Either way luck negates moral responsibility. So no one is morally responsible for what they do. Some of Hartman's proposed counterexamples to Levy trade on the fine details of Levy's account, and one wonders whether they would be successful against the broader picture of Levy's argument. That is, will Levy's car run with a couple of tweaks, or is his design hopelessly flawed? Hartman addresses this point, and tries to argue that agents generally retain enough control over their actions for moral responsibility, even given the background influence of luck. Luck can still pose a problem for moral responsibility in the way of the traditional moral luck cases, but doesn't negate moral responsibility tout court. Hartman acknowledges that there are other skeptical arguments out there besides Levy's, so his is not a wholly general refutation of luck-based moral skepticism. Different judges may disagree about who is ahead on points at the end of 12 rounds of Hartman vs. Levy, but rejecting his sort of moral skepticism does at least seem like a reasonable dialectical move.

A different kind of danger of moral luck is what, in Chapter 4, Hartman calls 'The Counterfactual View'. The root idea is that when agents S and S* are actually or subjunctively identical with respect to an event X (except for factors outside of their control) then S and S* are equally praiseworthy or blameworthy with respect to X. So in Nagel's classic drunk driver case, the drunk who unluckily hits a pedestrian and the drunk who gets home safely are equally morally blameworthy, even if the former has a wider scope of causal responsibility. The moral luck intuition is supposed to be that bad luck made the pedestrian-hitting driver morally worse. The Counterfactual View rejects that result.

The problem with counterfactual analyses is that they are always tempting but never work. Hartman rightly points out that the Counterfactual View is committed to (1) morally ordinary citizens who would commit atrocities under unusual circumstances (but still in nearby worlds) are now rightly seen as moral monsters, and (2) morally ordinary citizens who never perform acts of moral heroism (but would in nearby worlds) are now properly viewed as saints. You could be an angel or a devil without lifting a finger. Why bother with morally significant actions in the actual world? Counterfactual worlds have got you covered. That's a very unappealing result.

There's also a variety of metaphysical problems in trying to determine what someone would freely do in a counterfactual circumstance. If it is true that "if Charles were to lose his job then he would become depressed and turn to pathological gambling for solace," what exactly grounds that truth? Hartman argues that none of the obvious contenders pans out. A big part of the problem is that whatever might ground one of these counterfactuals (the agent's actual character or actual volitions, say) runs the risk of making the counterfactual statement determinately true. That's bad because determinism threatens to strip the agent of moral responsibility altogether and therefore erases whatever subtleties moral luck is supposed to highlight.

Hartman defends the idea that an agent is not additionally praiseworthy or blameworthy on account of a token consequence that she does not foresee and could not be reasonably expected to foresee (p. 92). That's a fine-sounding principle in theory, but I worry that in practice it will be heavily subject to hindsight bias. The entire basis of hindsight bias is when, after some event occurs, we turn around and say how predictable it was in the first place, and only a fool could have missed the warning signs. What's the chance of a poor harvest next year? That's not easy to answer; agriculture is multicausally sensitive to all kinds of inputs that themselves are chaotic. What was the chance of last year's poor harvest? We should have all seen that coming, what with global warming (or El Niño, the drought, the locusts, immigrants, or whatever your hobbyhorse). We can all promise ourselves that we will be extra careful to avoid hindsight bias, but that's the problem with cognitive biases -- we usually fall for them anyway. So I'm concerned that an agent who, as a result of bad luck, causes a morally bad outcome will almost inevitably be told that she should have seen the risk to start with, and then blamed for the result.

Hartman draws an analogy between epistemic luck and moral luck (pp. 95-100). The strategy is to show that various sorts of epistemic luck are real, and this gives us reason to believe that the analogous forms of moral luck are also real. Some kinds of epistemic luck undermine how much credit a believer is due for getting the truth. The classic examples of this are Gettier cases. Hartman thinks that other sorts of epistemic luck provide the conditions or opportunity for knowledge, and don't intervene to prevent it. For example, the circumstantial luck of being in the right place and time to exercise our belief-acquiring methods merely provides the background conditions needed for epistemic agency (pp. 98-99). While I see the motivation here, I don't think this is quite right. Take barn cases. Being in fake barn country is bad circumstantial luck and gaining the truth through the use of ordinarily virtuous epistemic processes in that circumstance won't rise up to knowledge because of it. Circumstantial epistemic luck can thereby undermine knowledge.

So why do so many people deny the existence of moral luck? What explains the persistent intuition that the lucky drunk driver and the unlucky one are on a moral par and therefore equally blameworthy? In his final chapter, Hartman provides (following John Greco) an error theory. His explanation is that the lucky and unlucky drunk drivers are on a moral par as persons -- neither is a worse person than the other, and luck does not interfere with our judgments of their characters -- but that fact does not mean that they are equally blameworthy. Moral worth and moral responsibility are two separate things. This is a promising approach. Two tennis players can be evenly matched (they are equally virtuous players), but there will be only one winner in a match between them. Even if the win is the result of a lucky shot, the winner still deserves the trophy and the praise.

One final curmudgeonly complaint. There are scores of named Principles, Views, Strategies, and Theories. While this is a commonplace way to write analytic philosophy, it is regrettable, and it makes the book overly crabbed and difficult to follow. What exactly is the Elimination View again? That's different from the Skeptical View, right? And what was the Interpretive Suggestion about the Universal Luck Premise? Even for insiders in these debates, it's like trying to remember all the acronyms in a large bureaucracy. I recognize that in the thick of writing that these abbreviations seem natural and helpful, but to a cold reader they are unnecessarily dense.

I have made some criticisms in this review, but the highest praise one can give a philosopher is to take him seriously enough to attempt a refutation, and it is in that sense I mean my remarks as praise. Critics of moral luck will have to contend with the detailed defense that Hartman makes and should not be surprised if they find that Hartman has already dealt with their criticism. I have been unable to do more than discuss a few of the arguments. This book is not the last word on moral luck, but it is a valuable contribution to the ongoing discussion.