Natural Kinds and Conceptual Change

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LaPorte, Joseph, Natural Kinds and Conceptual Change, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 221p., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521825997.

Reviewed by John Dupre, University of Exeter


This book addresses the boundary between the philosophy of science and the philosophy of language. It concerns mainly the central topic to be found at that interface, natural kinds and natural-kind terms. The book also considers some questions about theory change, topics that are often thought to have been greatly illuminated by important ideas on natural kinds. The work is distinguished by detailed and serious attention to some real kinds and the ways they are distinguished, and develops a well-thought-out and generally convincing set of general views about the topic. It constitutes a significant contribution to what has become a very extensive philosophical literature.

LaPorte’s view of natural kinds is agreeably and appropriately tolerant. For a kind to be natural, he suggests, is for it to have some explanatory value and this implies that naturalness, like explanatory value, is a matter of degree. The view is also naturally pluralistic: ‘the taxa recognized by different systems of classification may be natural in different respects’ (p.27). A difficulty with this line of thought is in preventing the conclusion that every kind (and hence, one might as well say, no kind) is natural: it’s hard to imagine a kind term so lacking in content that the reference of an individual to it could not help to explain anything about that individual. LaPorte acknowledges this problem and suggests that different contexts set different standards of explanatory usefulness against which the natural should be judged. In this book he proposes to adopt high standards which, it appears, only scientific terms will meet (p.26). I doubt whether this will work. I have no idea how to compare explanatory potential in a systematic way, and LaPorte doesn’t tell us how. Some scientific terms strike me as probably lower on the scale than many artefact terms. “Reinforced concrete beam” is a very useful term in explanations of how a wide variety of buildings stand up, but it would be odd to call it natural. “Gonadotropin-releasing hormone antagonist” is only useful for an extremely narrow range of explanatory functions, though it’s very good when you do need it, and plausibly very natural. Perhaps a bit more needs to be said about the nature in natural kinds.

The high standard of naturalness informs LaPorte’s discussion of whether vernacular terms for biological kinds name natural kinds. He equates the question with that of whether vernacular terms approximate scientific terms and concludes, plausibly enough, that sometimes they do and sometimes they don’t. He takes issue here with some examples of my own designed to show the non-coincidence of scientific and vernacular terms, but I’m pleased to say, leaving aside the details of some tricky cases, and a difference about the prevalence of divergence between the vernacular and the scientific, I can see no point of disagreement of principle. Although LaPorte insists in his preliminary discussion (pp.31-2) on the tendency of vernacular speakers to defer to experts, he also argues in great detail in subsequent chapters that whether vernacular terms are affected by scientific discoveries about their naturalness is a contingent matter. Thus experts have, for whatever reason, both decided and persuaded the general public that whales have turned out not to be fish (neither of which category is in fact a fully scientifically respectable taxonomic kind). In contrast, the public has not been encouraged to change their use of the term jade. The experts have simply decided--as lucidly described in chapter 4--that this has turned out not to be a natural kind but the conjunction of two natural kinds.

One of the most interesting general themes of the book, in fact, is the demonstration that conceptual change of this kind is not determined by a consistent policy with regard to scientific belief. Whether, for example, we shall end up deciding that birds are a kind of dinosaur (or vice versa) or rather that dinosaurs are not a (cladistically) respectable kind, remains to be seen. Given that these are just matters for decision, I think that LaPorte might well be more surprised that we are sometimes persuaded to make such bizarre revisions as, for example, that birds are dinosaurs. Generally, there does seem to be a tension between on the one hand LaPorte’s sensitivity to the contingency of these semantic histories, and on the other hand his idea that there is a constant tendency towards resolving vagueness and indeterminacy in our concepts. I doubt whether there is such a tendency and even whether it would be a good thing if there were. I can certainly imagine no benefit that might accrue from persuading people that snakes were lizards, birds were dinosaurs, and so on. Attention to the real interests people have in distinguishing kinds of organisms should make it clear that keeping up to date with current scientific beliefs about evolutionary history is not usually one of them.

LaPorte next asks whether the (numerous) natural kinds he allows have essences, and concludes that ‘a healthy portion of essentialism about kinds withstands scrutiny’. Here I disagree, though more with this summary than with much of the actual argumentation. It seems to me that very little of any interest survives scrutiny. LaPorte’s main positive point about essentialism starts from the observation that if, as is widely supposed, singular identity statements can express necessary truths, there is no reason why general identity statements shouldn’t do so too. And in fact arguments exactly parallel to those famously leading Saul Kripke from the necessary truth of such singular identity statements as “Hesperus is identical to Phosphorus” to the conclusion that these terms are rigid designators, can be applied to statements of kind identity. LaPorte offers as an example the terms ‘brontosaurus’ and ‘apatosaurus’ demonstrably alternate names for the same genus of dinosaurs. “Brontosaurus = Apatosaurus”, he claims, states a necessary truth. So far this is just a plausible elaboration of the Kripkean notion of rigid designation. But Laporte also thinks there are more theoretically interesting descriptions of taxa, such as “the clade that stems from the ancestral group G”, are rigid. There are thus lots of necessary truths of the form, taxon X is the clade descended from ancestral group G, and this descent may be considered the essence of the taxon.

I cannot pretend to understand the argument for this rigidity claim. Against the possibility that such descriptions of clades may fail to be rigid, LaPorte remarks that “When biologists discuss counterfactuals, they identify one clade across possible worlds just by its stem, possession of which is evidently supposed to be a necessary and sufficient condition in any possible world for being the relevant clade” (p.46). To this I can only say that I have never heard any biologist discussing anything of the kind, and I suspect it would be very difficult to persuade most biologists to do so. I have no intuition as to what they might say were they so persuaded. No doubt unsure of the force of this argument, LaPorte backs it up with the alternative that the definition may be stipulative and hence rigid de jure. Perhaps so. But the possibility that scientists may construct necessary truths by defining their terms, pace Quinean worries about analyticity that LaPorte explicitly rejects, says little of interest about essentialism. He is consistently opposed to the notion that essences are in any interesting sense discovered. Moreover, even though he thinks taxa have essences, for good biological reasons he does not believe that members of taxa necessarily share these essences. Biological essences that have nothing to say about individual organisms strike me as toothless.

I think, incidentally, that LaPorte also overstates the dominance among biologists of cladistic definitions of taxa of the kind invoked in his essentialist argument—or at least underestimates the force of the objections to such definitions. No doubt cladism is the most influential contemporary school of taxonomy. But it does face serious problems. One such problem is that cladism assumes a traditional divergent phylogenetic tree. But the possibility of such a tree is generally threatened by the increasing realisation of the prevalence of lateral genetic transfer and the consequent difficulty in providing definitions of ancestral groups. For the case of unicellular organism this problem seems likely to be insuperable and cladistic taxonomy to be impossible. Since these are the enormous majority of all extant organisms, and the only organisms that existed at all for most of the history of life, this is hardly a trivial problem. Fortunately LaPorte seems to be quite clearly a pluralist about species, though for reasons I could not discern he seems to think that pluralism is a kind of monism: “the idea that scientists might discover what makes one species concept, pluralistic or monistic, the one to adopt seems exceedingly dim” (p.75). This idea is indeed dim. Pluralism expresses exactly such a doubt and is not, of course, one species concept.

Chapters five and six turn to the issues in the philosophy of language that have been widely associated with views about natural kinds. It has become commonplace to claim that one great benefit of the Putnam/Kripke theory of natural-kind reference is that it secures stability of meaning across theoretical change. LaPorte’s nuanced accounts of the development of reference over time show clearly that stability cannot be guaranteed by either direct referential or descriptivist accounts. However he also argues, also convincingly, that the disastrous consequences sometimes alleged to flow from instability, such as incommensurability and the consequent impossibility of scientific progress, are easily avoided. I suppose that worries of these kinds have generally receded from the central concerns of philosophers of science, but LaPorte does a good job of explaining why it is right that they have done so.

The final chapter addresses a possible objection to the defence of commensurability, and to a good deal of what has gone before, that a distinction has been assumed between change of theory and change of meaning. But it is sometimes supposed that Quine has shown that no such distinction is possible. LaPorte’s view throughout the book is that the historical development of kind terms typically involves a temporal sequence of change in belief followed by change in meaning. So, for example, the acceptance of the theory of evolution required and prompted the modification of the concept of ‘species’ to remove the condition that a species included all the relatives of its members. Of course, it would be possible to leave meanings unchanged and conclude instead that there had been discovered to be only one species, and hence to deny that any species had ever evolved into a different species. But the possibility of different responses to theoretical change hardly shows them to be, after all, the same. Suffice it to say here that I, at least, found LaPorte’s anti-Quinean line of argument generally persuasive.

I have spent some time on my disagreements with LaPorte’s book but, as noted, I think these disagreements are generally more superficial than they might appear. I interpret LaPorte as the most minimalist essentialist and a pluralist in occasional denial, positions I applaud. These tendencies are even more clearly elaborated in an excellent chapter on chemical kinds. The example mentioned earlier of jade, which has been discussed casually but inaccurately in the literature, is here developed in impressive detail to show just how complex and contingent the histories of kind terms can turn out to be. Finally, the book is clearly written and thoroughly researched. Anyone interested in natural kinds either from the perspective of philosophy of science or of philosophy of language will want to read it.