Natural Moral Law in Contemporary Society

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Holger Zaborowski (ed.), Natural Moral Law in Contemporary Society, Catholic University of America Press, 2010, 359pp., $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780813217864.

Reviewed by Chris Tollefsen, University of South Carolina





This collection includes eleven essays which were presented in fall of 2005 at the Catholic University of America as part of a lecture series devoted to the subject of the natural law. The series was prompted by a letter sent by then Joseph Cardinal Ratzinger to various Catholic institutions asking them to reflect upon this topic. Accordingly, the volume begins with an essay by Ratzinger on the moral law, the only essay in the collection not to have been delivered at CUA.

In that essay, Ratzinger establishes the problem with which many of the essays grapple: how can a dialogue emerge between the competing ideologies of postmodernity over the subject of the moral foundations of law and culture? We find ourselves in a time in which multiple cultures and multiple religions vie with one another ideologically and politically; in previous eras, Ratzinger notes, such conflicts have given birth to the idea of a law of nations (the ius gentium), which transcends local cultures and legal forms, or a natural law, which transcends "the confessional borders of faith" (19). Ratzinger evinces some wariness at the name "natural law," suggesting as it does that the rationality in nature is of a teleological form which many believe suspect; but he suggests that an intercultural and inter-religious dialogue will be able to vindicate the ideas of rights and obligations, and of rational nature, that are necessary if law is to have a foundation in morality.

Ratzinger's wariness notwithstanding, many of the other authors argue for precisely the view that the rational nature that undergirds morality is essentially teleological, and several are explicit in their commitment to the idea that the teleological structure is much like that envisaged by pre-modern philosophers in the Aristotelian tradition. Natural teleology as a ground for ethics is front and center in essays by Robert Sokolowski, David Oderberg, J. Budziszewski, and Jean de Groot; it is similarly important in Luke Gormally's treatment of the nature of health and Francis Slade's account of political philosophy and the state. The volume contains a number of other essays on related themes: Mary Keys' chapter on Aquinas on the common good, V. Bradley Lewis' essay on public reason, and Jorge L.A. Garcia's essay arguing for the foundational superiority of a virtue approach in ethics. It concludes with two essays not as centrally related to the dominant themes of the book, one by Nelson Lund on Supreme Court jurisprudence, the other by John Rist on aesthetics and ethics. While these final two essays have many fine qualities, my comments will mostly consider the core essays that address the topic of teleology and the natural law.

A key claim of these core essays is, to reiterate, the necessity of teleology in nature if there is to be an adequate grounding for natural law ethics. A set of natural ends for human nature, on this view, would be available normatively to govern human purposes; by contrast, writes Sokolowski, echoing a concern of Ratzinger's, in modernity and beyond, there are human purposes only -- that which individual agents have chosen autonomously to pursue -- but no governance in nature for those purposes, i.e., no ends. Slade likewise sees this as the key difference between modern and classical political philosophy. Where an earlier age considered the polis to be something natural with its own form and, accordingly, asked what the best kind of political regime is, modern political philosophy, beginning with Hobbes, denies that there is a natural telos of the state. Rather, in a comparison made explicit by Kant, the sovereign is, like the critical intellect, self-legislating, ungoverned by any pre-existing "ought." The "natural" state, by contrast, is formless, a war of all against all.

Four recurring themes permeate the discussion of natural teleology as the ground, or basis, of natural law. The first is the way in which this teleology, and general ordered-ness, must encompass not just human nature but the entire cosmos (which as Oderberg points out, is itself the Greek word for order). After arguing that the universe is ordered, not random, Oderberg turns to biological nature and argues that "the normative teleology of the organic world serves as the basis for a theory of specifically human teleology, and it is this latter that forms the particular subject matter … of natural law theory in ethics" (63).

A second theme is an understanding of that which has a telos and is ordered by an ordering agent to an end, as having a "function," and "design." Grasp of function plays an important epistemological role in enabling human beings their first primitive understanding of what the normative demands of their nature are. It also plays, clearly, a metaphysical role in that it is thought to be characteristic of beings with natures to have functions; and it is as having a function that normativity is applicable to a being: there is something that it ought to do, in accordance with its function or design.

Third, and following from the second, many of the authors in this volume make clear that they reject the fact-value distinction and the claim that inference from "is" to "ought" is illicit. Fourth, and relatedly, several of the authors, most explicitly Oderberg, signal their unease with the so-called "new natural law theory," the adherents of which (Joseph Boyle, John Finnis, Germain Grisez, and others) accept the fact-value distinction, deny that metaphysical knowledge grounds moral knowledge, and in general show an unwillingness to talk of human function or design.

New natural lawyers do not, nor are they alleged to, deny that there is an ontological grounding in human nature for morality. Were human nature different, human goods would be as well, and morality is based on an apprehension of human goods and well-being. Nor must the new natural lawyers deny that teleology pervades the natural world. Indeed, they could, and should, assert that recognition of such natural teleology as does exist helps provide an edifying theoretical frame for the picture of human nature that emerges from reflection on our practical knowledge. Human beings are not the only beings with interests, goods, and fulfillments, and a theoretical picture of what it means to have a nature and a good should take into account the similarities and dissimilarities between human beings and the rest of nature.

But the gap between the new natural lawyers and the more traditional Aristotelian-Thomists represented in this volume is nevertheless significant. And the most prominent difference is, again, the well-known refusal of the new theorists to ground practical knowledge in a theoretical understanding of nature. Rather, they hold that first practical principles -- principles directing the pursuit of basic human goods, such as "knowledge is a good to be pursued" -- are grasped self-evidently by practical reason. This grasp is made possible by attention to the objects towards which we are oriented by our inclinations, rather than by a third-person investigation of those inclinations or of any other existing reality.

Oderberg makes an interesting objection to this view, writing that "An agent's experience of his own inclinations will not on its own yield knowledge of what is good for others unless combined with an understanding or appreciation, however attenuated, of the place of inclinations of that kind in human beings as a kind" (72). Leaving aside the claim about experience "on its own," which is not entirely accurate -- experience provides data for practical reflection but is not itself identical to or determinative of, practical knowledge -- still, one can question whether Oderberg's larger claim about the need for knowledge of human beings as a kind is true.

Consider children who are raised in a loving environment. They manifest inclinations to most of the substantive goods identified by the new theorists: they seek nourishment and other health-conducive states of affairs, they play, they enjoy bright colors and patterns. But their experience of these inclinations, and their growing practical grasp of the goods, seems pervaded by an inclination towards, and eventually a grasp of, the good of sociality from a very early age. Children seek food at the breast of another, whose face they try to touch, whose smiles they return, and with whom they very early on learn to communicate and share primitive jokes. And this sociality is shared out from the child-parent relationship to siblings and extended family members almost effortlessly. No theoretical knowledge of the human kind or of the role of inclinations for members of that kind seems necessary here; indeed, our early theoretical understanding of what human beings are seems mediated by the interest in and pursuit of the goods which we share with other human beings. This early form of community is limited, and it can be difficult to extend the interest in the good of others to those outside one's most immediate circle. But at the most primitive level, the good of others does not seem to be a theoretical problem, but is rather among the earliest practical achievements of the developing human.

This achievement does not seem to be mediated in the agent by considerations of function or design but rather, insofar as the agent is coming to practical awareness of options towards which she is directed by inclinations, by considerations of what is desirable and beneficial. But are the notions of function and design at least helpful theoretical concepts for framing a larger metaphysical picture within which the human agent's practical understanding can be situated? Perhaps there is a space for describing activities and virtues characteristically found in upright human beings in functional terms. Similarly, as Gormally convincingly argues in his contribution, the language of biological function is essential to an understanding of the nature of health in an organism.

But there are also limits to the value of such language. Where "function" is concerned, we should avoid, I believe, drawing on the connections between biological structure and activity, on the one hand, and apprehended good, on the other, with a view to arguing for the goodness of the apprehended good -- the perverted function argument is best left in the past. And we should resist the desire to speak of the human person as an entity which has itself a function, as Aristotle was inclined to speak: neither some particular activity such as contemplation, nor an inclusive end such as happiness, seem adequately described as the function of the human being, even though they are human ends for the human being. For a functional part, entity, or activity has value in virtue of that for the sake of which it is functional; but the human being does not stand in this relationship to anything: human beings have value in themselves. (Garcia, in his account of "virtues-based moral theory", argues for the centrality of roles and relationships as features of human nature that exercise normative demands, yet also expresses skepticism as regards the idea of a "function" of the human being.)

Design seems of even more limited use. It is common to virtually every natural law theory, and certainly to every Thomistic theory, that our nature, which underwrites our capacities for flourishing, is created. Moreover, in the wider theistic and usually Christian framework within which the natural law tradition has developed, human beings are created for something: they are created for their own fulfillment and for the glory of God. Why not say, then, that they have a design, that they were designed?

I think the answer here is that the idea of design is paradigmatically to be found in the domain of the artifactual. "Design" speaks to what is constructed, to that which is a product of the imposition of form on pre-existing matter, in service of some end to which the designer is, in the absence of the designed entity, deficient. But none of these claims characterizes the relationship between God and human beings among natural law theorists, traditional or new. God's creation ex nihilo, and, in the case of the creation of human beings, at least, creation for the sake of the good of the created and as an expression of the goodness of the creator, seems remarkably unlike the act of a designer working within the scope of a problem in need of a solution. So design seems an inapt way of characterizing the teleological essence of the human being, and the natural world, that natural law theorists agree is a matter of ontological fact.

Design and function are of greater importance, however, in understanding the nature of the political state, for the state should be seen as an artifact of human persons, designed for the sake of certain goods which would otherwise be inadequately obtainable. It is this conception of the state, I believe, which underwrites a point argued for by Lewis against Rawls (in the context of a larger discussion of the idea of public reason), that the classical conception of the relationship between truth and politics was not that the point of politics was to embody the "whole truth." The political state does not exist in order to promote the unrestricted well-being and virtue of all human beings, but for the more limited ends of justice and peace. This insight does sit in some tension, in the classical tradition, with a description of the state as being like an organism for which its citizens are functional parts -- here the dangers of thinking of human persons as having a function are apparent.

There are a number of very strong essays in this collection. It might have been desirable, given the focus on natural teleology and the natural law, to include a proponent of the new natural law theory among the speakers of the original lecture series; and a couple of the essays are not thematically entirely consonant with the orientation of the majority. But this is a helpful volume which articulates an unconventional approach to metaphysics, ethics, and politics, and does so with rigor, clarity, and conviction.