Nature, Reason, and the Good Life: Ethics for Human Beings

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Roger Teichmann, Nature, Reason, and the Good Life: Ethics for Human Beings, Oxford University Press, 2011, 192pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199606177.

Reviewed by Erasmus Mayr, The Queen's College Oxford


At a time when many philosophers appear to believe that major philosophical problems can be nicely separated and treated almost in isolation from each other, Roger Teichmann's book comes as a timely reminder to the contrary. Both in its general approach and in its execution, it is the very opposite of those highly specialized books which are conceived as near-exhaustive and extremely detailed examinations of narrowly circumscribed topics. Teichmann's impressively comprehensive approach makes the book highly readable -- and accounts for some of its main philosophical virtues. But it also means that, unavoidably, his emphasis is often more on stating his views than on offering fully worked out arguments for them.

Teichmann characterizes his book as a study in 'linguistic philosophy' which is firmly rooted in the philosophical tradition of Elizabeth Anscombe and which attempts to combine an 'Aristotelian' approach to ethics and a Wittgensteinian insistence on the crucial role of language and linguistic activity. Central to his particular way of combining these traditions is the insistence that our answers to the central questions of ethics -- as well as the possibility of asking these questions in the first place -- are constrained both by "what it is to be a human being, and also by the social character of language" (p. 134). But investigating (some of) these constraints is only one small aspect of the book as a whole: for it is coupled with a veritable tour de force over an enormous variety of related issues, ranging from traditional core questions in ethics, metaethics, epistemology, and the philosophy of mind, to criticisms of many trends in contemporary society and philosophy. In the course of this tour, topics ranging from the objectivity of practical reasoning, and from liberalism and individualism in political philosophy, to the value of art, 'ontologisms' in philosophy, lifestyle and euphemisms, and to the role of offense in contemporary culture are all discussed, to name but a few.

This highly comprehensive approach is chosen self-consciously, since Teichmann holds that the aim of philosophy is to make things intelligible by locating them within a 'bigger picture' (p. 169). His polemical and, at times, essayistic style of writing makes his book refreshing and engaging. But one cannot help feeling that some 'forays' into related issues had better been left out because Teichmann lacks the space to properly argue for his claims about these topics and because one would like to see some more detailed argument for his general, more conventionally 'philosophical' claims.

Teichmann's way of proceeding involves regularly taking up previously developed ideas in different contexts, as well as repeated asides and cross-references to earlier and later parts of the text. This makes it, at times, more difficult to follow the main strand of his overall argument -- and it also makes it seem less advisable to give a strictly chronological overview of the book. Instead, I shall pick out six central ideas, which -- as I see it -- provide the backbone of the book.

Teichmann's first central idea is that ethics is essentially anthropocentric in two crucial respects: the subject-matter of ethics is what is humanly important, and reasons and reasoning about what we should do or believe are anchored in human language-games. Both what counts as a good reason, or as good reasoning, and which questions can sensibly be asked in the first place, depends on the nature and the purposes of the language-games in which the request 'why are you doing this?' (or 'why do you think that?') and its cognates can be raised. Two aspects of those language-games are particularly important in this respect: the social character of our linguistic activities, and our 'natural' or 'normal' conspecific impulses. The social character of our linguistic activities has two important consequences (which are discussed in ch.1):

(i) The idea of a contextless enquiry for truth -- as paradigmatically expressed in Descartes' Meditations -- is illusory, because every search for reasons must be set in the context of a real enquiry, which, at least in principle, presupposes the need or desire to arrive at knowledge. Similarly illusory is the idea of an ethical 'viewpoint of the universe' which transcends human interests and impartially considers what 'objectively matters' (a line of thought which Teichmann identifies in standard anti-speciesist arguments).

(ii) The social nature of human linguistic activity and of the language-game of asking for reasons introduces an inherently 'altruistic' bias for what can count as good practical reasoning. For the question 'why are you doing that?' can, in principle, always be asked by the person 'upon whom' the agent is acting (p. 12). In consequence, 'I'm going to help person X' can, by itself, count as a good reason for acting in a certain way, while 'I'm thereby going to hurt person X' cannot; since only the former, but not the latter, can, without further explanation, be given as an intelligible answer to the request for a reason, when this request comes from the person upon whom the agent is acting (i.e., X himself).

The second central idea is that the language-game of asking for and giving reasons is built upon our natural, 'pre-rational' impulses and needs. Our possession of key ethical and psychological concepts depends on the fact that we naturally respond to others in certain ways (e.g., by having certain emotions and impulses); these responses are responsible for our basic ethical attitudes. These attitudes, e.g., the attitude towards another as a person, are therefore at bottom pre-rational (p. 34).

The third central idea, a consequence of the first two, is that what can count as a reason, and as a good reason, is further constrained by what kind of beings we are, and what kinds of behaviour are 'normal' or 'natural' for us. This involves at least the following key ideas:

(i) We can provide a reason for an agent's behaviour by exhibiting it as an instance of a normal or natural pattern, because we can plausibly expect human beings to make sense of activities that are normal or natural to them (p. 12).

(ii) Providing reasons is connected to providing desirability characteristics of one's activities (in Anscombe's sense). And there are limits of intelligibility on what you can want -- or what can count as a desirability characteristic. Partly, Teichmann is alluding here to pathological cravings, which can be literally unintelligible; like wanting a pin, but not for any understandable purpose (cases which had already been discussed by Anscombe in her 'Intention'). But Teichmann thinks that there are even further limits of intelligibility which derive from what people need. For, he argues, we couldn't "conceive of human beings who never pursued what they took to be good for them" (p. 77), and people cannot be radically mistaken about what is good for them, or about what they need. In making sense of someone's actions we must therefore presuppose that, at least generally, he desires what is good for him (which does not imply, however, that he so desires in every particular case).

(iii) Since desires can clash with what is really good for the agent, desirability characteristics only provide prima facie good reasons for action. What is really good for the agent is connected to the notion of a good life, and what counts as a good life is largely determined by what is natural or normal for human beings. For these latter activities, to an important degree, constitute a good human life (pp. 59ff.).

The fourth central idea is that many psychological states and emotions are species of 'syndromes' of reactions and feelings (i.e., they are tied to clusters of behaviours, feelings etc., rather than to isolated and momentary states). Most of theses 'syndromes' involve some relation to reasons for the relevant feelings, reactions etc. These reasons are, at times, even essential to the identity of these emotions (e.g., in the case of pride, since we cannot feel pride about things which have nothing to do with us). This implies that emotions and inner states are not generally 'beyond rational justification'. Indeed, for Teichmann, the idea that there are states which are generally excepted from claims for justification, but for which the person can claim a certain moral importance -- such as the feeling of offense in modern-day culture -- is inherently incoherent (pp. 37ff.). Even pleasure is not a state which is 'above rational justification', since there are constraints of intelligibility on what we can find pleasant. The fact that 'for pleasure' typically provides an answer to the 'why do you do X?' question (with which Teichmann extensively deals in ch. 3) is, instead, tied to the fact that there is a (further) 'rationale-supplying' answer to the question 'what is the pleasure in doing X?' (p. 119).

The fifth central idea is that there is an inherent tension in the notion of a 'good life' between activity and rest, between an ongoing process and an end-state. With regard to ethics, a particularly important source of that tension lies in the fact that many of the virtues which give special meaning to our lives -- such as courage, charity etc. -- make sense only in a world which has grave shortcomings. A world without these shortcomings would also be one in which our lives lacked the special meaning which can be bestowed onto them by these virtues. To some extent, this tension can be reconciled within what Teichmann calls a 'contemplative attitude' towards both history in general and to one's own life, an attitude that takes the good as well as the bad aspects to have their place in one overarching scheme of things (p. 148).

The sixth central idea is that the value of philosophy for a good life is connected to the fact that similar virtues are involved both in philosophizing and in thinking well about human life. While philosophy has the task of setting phenomena within a larger context, a 'contemplative' attitude involves, at bottom, the same thing -- i.e., appreciating something's proper significance by seeing how it figures in a larger setting. And achieving a contemplative attitude is an important aspect of having a good life, since it allows us to be, as Teichmann puts it, 'on good terms with the universe' (p. 169).

Comments and Criticism

Due to the enormous richness and variety of Teichmann's discussion, I have to restrict myself to a few points of comment and criticism. This is unfortunate, since many of the different discussions which form part of the book would deserve more detailed examination on their own. I will first raise two related issues which concern the very heart of Teichmann's argument, as I see it. Afterwards, I will briefly go into at least one of his -- many -- reflections on side-issues.

As I have stated, Teichmann's central contention is that the social nature of language-games and what it is natural or normal for us to do put constraints on what can count as (good) reasons. Given the crucial importance of this central contention, it is somewhat disappointing that he says very little -- too little, in my view -- as to how they do so. It is one thing to accept that there must be some such constraints, given that the notion of a (good) reason has its origin in an interpersonal 'language-game' of giving reasons to others. But it is quite another matter to establish which specific constraints follow from this -- and I do not think that Teichmann really succeeds in showing which substantive constraints do follow. Let me illustrate this with regard to the social character of the activity of giving reasons, and our 'natural' behaviour, in turn.

With regard to the social character, it seems compelling to argue that it will give rise to some constraints of interpersonal intelligibility for reasons. Plausibly, what counts as a good reason cannot be a purely first-personal matter. But can we infer an inherently 'altruistic' bias of practial reasoning from the fact that justification is a primarily social phenomenon, as Teichmann claims?

I am very skeptical that we can. For what Teichmann's inference crucially relies on is the idea that the question 'why are you doing that?' can always, in principle, come from the person on whom the person is acting. But why should all language-games within which the demand for reasons arises be necessarily so inclusive? Why, in particular, should these practices always include the 'victims' of human misdeeds as well as the agents? Think of a tribal language-game where it is essential to the 'tribal' character of the game that a genuine justification is only given to other members of the tribe (e.g., the tribe believes itself to be radically different from all neighbouring tribes, with which it is in continual warfare). In such a setting, a member of the tribe, when he is, e.g., wounding enemies in battle, does not, even in principle, have to give reasons for his actions to the person on whom he acts, as far as the nature of the language-game in which he has learned to give reasons goes. It is only to his fellow tribesmen that he must, in principle, be able to provide such an answer, and here adducing the reason 'because it hurts X' (where X is a member of an enemy tribe) seems as good an answer to the question 'why are you doing this?' as any.

What will be acceptable answers to the 'why' question will heavily rely on the nature, needs and interests of the particular human beings engaged in the language-games in question, as well as on the degree of 'inclusiveness' of these games (i.e., on whether their possible participants are only members of a smaller or larger social group, or all human beings). Since all these factors can differ widely among different societies, it is hard to see how there will be much substantive constraint on the content of what can count as a (good) reason, which follows from the social character of linguistic activity per se.

It remains similarly unclear, in my view, how what is 'natural' or 'normal' to human beings constrains what can count as good reasons. The problem can best be put in terms of the often-used distinction between 'justifying' and 'explanatory' reasons. Teichmann doesn't use these terms himself, but he distinguishes between 'reasons' and 'good reasons', as well as between the first-/second-person perspective of deliberation and justification and the third-person perspective of explaining another agent's behaviour by appeal to his motives. Even if the latter kind of explanation may also involve an element of justification, this is certainly a much more 'attenuated' notion of justification than the one involved in full-blown first-person perspective justification (cf. p. 73).

When we look at 'explanatory' reasons -- those which allow us to make sense of what another person is doing -- there is a straightforward connection between explaining actions by citing such reasons and 'normal' human activities, a connection which Teichmann himself rightly stresses. It does indeed help me to make sense of another's actions to see this behaviour as an instance of a humanly natural pattern of behaviour. For I am generally able to make sense of such humanly natural patterns. But how does this point transfer to 'justifying' reasons? Why should these, too, be connected to what is natural?

In some places, it seems that Teichmann makes this transition by simply shifting between 'reason' and 'good reason', without clearly distinguishing between two kinds of requests for reasons, namely between the question 'why did he do that?', which wants to make sense of another's behaviour, and the question 'why was it okay for him to do that?', which asks for a justification of the behaviour. (E.g. when he writes that "the demand for reasons is a demand for reasons that normal human beings will in general be liable to accept. Accepting a reason as a good reason means . . . dropping any cause for complaint or dissatisfaction", p. 35.) But these passages are probably mere oversights. For, officially, he keeps these two ideas apart, and, in particular, he doesn't want to claim that all natural impulses and natural behaviour of human beings are connected to good reasons, since "the humanly natural includes much that we wish to discourage" (p. 74). But how can he single out those natural impulses and activities that provide good reasons from the others?

As we have already seen, Teichmann appeals to the social character of linguistic activity and intelligibility constraints to do the trick. But will these constraints be sufficient for singling out good reasons? I do not think so; to see why, let's go through the proposed sources of constraints in turn. (a) The social character of linguistic activity: After our discussion of social character, it seems unlikely that this will per se provide a substantive criterion. (b) Intelligibility constraints on desires: This constraint plausibly works in some areas -- especially in the field of outright unintelligible pathological cravings. But it hardly covers the whole area of natural behaviour and impulses that are not connected to good reasons. Just think of all-too-natural feelings of envy, which are far from unintelligible, but, supposedly, don't provide good reasons. (c) Human needs: Will we get the required further restrictions on which impulses are connected to good reasons by appealing to further intelligibility constraints derived from human needs? This is rather unlikely, because such a strategy will face two fundamental problems. On the one hand, within Teichmann's own account, this proposal will smack of circularity as long as needs themselves are ultimately tied to what is humanly natural and normal (via their connection to the good life) and as long as we lack any general rationale for what makes a life good. (And Teichmann himself seems to explicitly deny that there is any such general and non-circular rationale: Ultimately only the reasonable person can say which aims are good and which aren't -- where being a reasonable person depends itself on pursuing the right kinds of aims, p. 66) On the other hand, it is unclear how the connection to human needs is supposed to provide any substantive constraint on particular impulses. For, remember, this connection was based on the entirely general claim that we cannot conceive of human beings who never pursued their good. This does not imply for any specific natural desire that it cannot be for what is bad for the agent.

Therefore, I fail to see how Teichmann can distinguish in a principled way between those natural impulses that provide good reasons and those that do not. Can he escape this impasse by accepting that all natural impulses that are intelligible provide, in principle, good reasons -- they only can be overridden, in some cases, by conflicting reasons against performing an action? (In some places, this is the solution Teichmann actually seems to favour, cf. p. 107.) But an 'outweighing' procedure of this kind will not generally get us from what is natural to good reasons, either. In some cases, for instance, intelligible and normal behaviour lacks good reasons which support it not because there are other countervailing considerations, but simply because it is based on wrong beliefs. It may be perfectly natural and intelligible for people to regularly drink coffee, as long as they think it is good for their health. But when it turns out that drinking coffee is deeply harmful, these people do not have a reason for drinking coffee that is (now) outweighed by other considerations. Instead, it has turned out that the fact they did consider as a reason for drinking coffee didn't obtain at all. (Similar considerations apply to cases where apparent reasons are nullified by other considerations, rather than resting on false beliefs.)

So, I take it, there remains an open question how the 'natural' or 'normal' and the 'good' and 'good reasons' are to be related. While it is plausible to assume that we can understand an agent's behaviour when it is shown to be normal -- i.e., that this provides us with an explanatory reason for his behaviour -- there is no obvious way to show that we can thereby, even in general, justify this behaviour. And, when we think of natural character traits like cruelty and of societies in which living out one's cruel impulses vis-à-vis some racial or religious group is regarded as both a natural and 'good' way of behaviour, it may be feared that this gap cannot be bridged at all, unless we draw on resources which go far beyond the social character of linguistic activities and beyond what it is 'natural' for human beings to do.

Teichmann makes a number of 'forays' into topics which are related to his general enquiry. Often, these forays are interesting and enlightening (e.g., his treatment of the role of 'offense' in contemporary culture.) But others are less fortunate, mainly because they deal with their topics with a brevity which cannot do them justice. A good example for this is Teichmann's treatment of (political) liberalism and one of its central principles, the so-called harm-principle (i.e., the principle that the state shouldn't interfere with citizens' actions unless these harm or threaten others). Teichmann's attack on classical liberalism, especially as defended by J.S. Mill, and on the harm-principle, is based on connecting them to the view that desires are intrinsically valuable, independently of their content and, in this respect, above rational criticism (p. 82). But surely this is not a basic tenet of classical liberalism in general -- just think of Kantian liberalism, which puts respect for autonomy centre-stage and where autonomy cannot be reduced to desire-satisfaction. Even in Mill's own philosophy, it is very debatable whether his liberalism really relied on the view that desires are above rational criticism, rather than on the view that free 'value experiments' by individuals were necessary to find out what is really valuable (or more valuable than other things). But whatever Mill's own views may have been, 'liberalism' -- and even 'classical liberalism' -- in political philosophy is just a cover-word for too many different doctrines, which do not all rely on a joint basic foundation. So any attempt to criticize them by connecting them to such a foundation risks, at the very least, distortion by oversimplification.

Overall, however, the drawbacks from Teichmann's overly 'overarching' approach which I have indicated are, in my view, far outweighed by the richness of the book both with regard to insights on particular questions and with regard to the enlightening connections he draws between different areas of philosophy. And Teichmann's attempt to give a comprehensive picture of ethics and its connections to other fields is, in itself, undoubtedly impressive.

It is true that the book does sometimes suffer from its over-inclusiveness, and, to some extent, it provides rather the sketch of an outlook on ethics and philosophy than a closely-knit argument for a specific theory. In consequence, some readers -- myself included -- will wish the book to have contained more detailed argument, even at the cost of being less encompassing. But, at the same time, it would be unfair to forget that, given Teichmann's general view on the philosophical enterprise, it is far from surprising that he puts more emphasis on sketching a 'general picture'. And it would clearly be quite wrong to deny that this latter project has its own importance and merit.

What I fear, though, is that Teichmann's procedure is unlikely to appeal to those who are not already initially sympathetic to his general approach, and will rather deter them from engaging with his study. And this would be a pity, since many of the points he makes will be worthwhile to think about even for those who reject the Wittgenstein-Anscombe tradition in philosophy, of which this study is a part.