Individual and Community in Nietzsche's Philosophy

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Julian Young (ed.), Individual and Community in Nietzsche's Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 247pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107049857.

Reviewed by Andrew Huddleston, Birkbeck, University of London


Nietzsche has often been held to be a highly individualistic thinker. According to this reading, he concerns himself with the wellbeing of a few choice individuals, and cares little about "the herd," except insofar as they are a help or a hindrance to these exceptional individuals and their project of self-cultivation. Julian Young's pioneering 2006 study Nietzsche's Philosophy of Religion questioned this traditional interpretation. It sought to situate Nietzsche in a strand of communitarian thinking, according to which the community as a whole, not individuals, is the primary locus of value. Such a community flourishes when it is united under the horizon of a shared worldview, especially one of guiding myths (whether of doctrinal religion or otherwise) that give intelligibility and meaning to human life. On Young's interpretation, it is not just in Nietzsche's early work that these communitarian themes predominate; confining them here would be a more widely accepted and uncontroversial claim among Nietzsche scholars. Rather, Young argues that they persist right to the end of Nietzsche's career.

The present volume builds on this interpretive outlook -- developing, challenging and expanding it. It grew out of a conference on these themes at Wake Forest University in 2012. Some of the papers are directly focused on the particular problematic that Young sets up; others take the themes of individual and community more broadly, using them as a lens for investigating different aspects of Nietzsche's philosophy.

Young's own contribution develops some themes from his 2006 book. He frames Nietzsche's approach by exploring similar themes in Hegel and Wagner and later in Heidegger. The main question Young takes up is about the role of the great individual on this story. On his interpretation, the great individual is valuable, not in himself, but because of his contributions to the life and wellbeing of the community (25).

While I am broadly in sympathy with Young's corrective against an overemphasis on Nietzsche's individualism, and indeed carry forward a related interpretive project myself, I am skeptical of various aspects of his communitarian reading, particularly when it comes to the idea that great individuals serve just as a means and not also as end-in-themselves. Maudemarie Clark and Monique Wonderly, in their excellent contribution, develop a similar sort of skepticism and challenge Young's account of the merely instrumental value of great individuals. They make a strong textual case that Nietzsche actually regards great individuals as valuable in themselves. With this, they arrive at the plausible middle ground position that, by Nietzsche's lights, both individuals and communities are valuable for their own sake. Expanding what Clark and Wonderly say, I think it might also be worthwhile to distinguish community [Gemeinschaft] from culture [Kultur/Cultur] and to pose similar questions with this distinction in view. Michelangelo is both part of a Renaissance community and part of the Renaissance culture. Perhaps Young is right to say that such a figure would stand in a largely instrumental relationship with the flourishing of the surrounding community, maybe by spurring it on through his shining example. Yet it is easier to see how this person's excellence needn't be merely instrumental in its connection with the background culture. It might stand in a constitutive relationship to the excellent culture, because the individual excellence (which, as Clark and Wonderly rightly say, is independently valuable in itself) is also a major component of that culture's excellence.

Another important aspect of Young's reading is his claim that the creation of myth can play an important role in sustaining a community. Ken Gemes and Chris Sykes take up this theme. They stress the extent to which Nietzsche is indebted to the German Romantics and to Wagner in thinking that myth is necessary for binding a community together and that the path to the revitalization of the German nation will require this sort of myth-making. They go on to make the thought-provoking suggestion that notions of culture and genius are at the center of a new mythology that Nietzsche is himself propagating, first with Wagner, and later with the idea of the great individual. One further question we might ask about Gemes and Sykes's interesting proposal is: What exactly, to quote their title, is the "myth of culture" here? The myth that there is the possibility of a great individual or culture, given the circumstances of Nietzsche's day? Or the myth that it would truly be valuable if there were one? Or both? Moreover, this way of thinking about myth makes its illusory dimension the most important thing about it; a myth works by deceiving one about how things are. Given Nietzsche's emphasis throughout his work on the value of illusions, this resonates strongly with his outlook. Yet this slant is different in its emphasis from that of many of the Romantics and from Wagner. While these figures would agree that myths are illusory in being false at the literal level, they would think that they are nonetheless true at a deeper archetypal level and that this truth-content is what is central to their value as myth.

One of the foremost hindrances to seeing Nietzsche as a champion of community is the derisive language in which he often describes groups of people. Terms such as "herd" and "rabble" are pervasive in Nietzsche's work, and they foster the impression that he has contempt for the mass of mankind and is interested only in a few great individuals. This impression is further solidified by Nietzsche's frequent praise for solitude. Kathleen Higgins's contribution acknowledges this important strand in Nietzsche's work, but she usefully highlights a number of points where Nietzsche's images of community are more positive: for example, the community in the form of "the Dionysian throng, caught up in the powerful and joyous flow of life" (83) or the community as a kind of "transgenerational edifice" (85).

Also speaking to the theme of potentially positive conceptions of community, Jessica Berry considers Nietzsche's relationship with a specific community, namely the scientific one. Nietzsche, as has been well-documented of late, had considerable interest in the natural sciences of his day. But despite this interest in science, Nietzsche, in places (e.g., GM III), seems to have a dim view of scientists themselves. Their results he finds interesting and fruitful; but he thinks of them as desiccated specimens, who get their only jolt of life from their perverse overvaluation of truth at all costs. Yet Goethe, as Berry convincingly shows, forms a kind of ideal for how scientific inquiry might be conducted in a healthier, non-ascetic spirit. Nietzsche's elective affinity with Goethe is not just as poet, but as Naturforscher, too.

Another hindrance to seeing Nietzsche as a champion of community is that his frequent denigration of selflessness and praise of egoism can make him seem individualist to the core. Ivan Soll reflects on these and related themes (pity, altruism, etc.) in Nietzsche. Soll carefully works through Nietzsche's skeptical claims about altruism and rightly concludes that while they "do not really show that there is no altruistic behavior, they do successfully undermine the moral ideal of pure selflessness that Schopenhauer had championed" (155). Less persuasive, however, was the "experientialism" he attributes to Nietzsche in a couple of places. According to Soll's Nietzsche, our ultimate goal is the feeling of power rather than the possession of power (149). But even though Nietzsche indeed stresses the importance of the feeling of power, do we (and should we) really prefer feeling power and not possessing it, to possessing it and not feeling it? Likewise, on Soll's experientialist reading, Nietzsche identifies our lives with our experience of our lives (165). Again, this seems questionable. To give only one example, those who are "born posthumously," in Nietzsche's wonderful phrase from Ecce Homo, would seem to have lives that, in some sense, outstrip their experience of them, in the way their influence and legacy continue and grow. In any event, the value of a life would not seem to be exhausted by the value of the experience of a life, particularly one's experience of one's own life. The evidence, to my mind, is not strong that Nietzsche accepted these experientialist views. But even if he did, it would be philosophically unfortunate; it would make him be in thrall to the misguided commitment that Nietzsche's archenemies the utilitarians hold so dear: namely, the axiology of feeling -- that impoverished calculus by which all that ultimately matters in the final reckoning is how things feel to us.

While it is right that Nietzsche is a trenchant critic of both the desirability and the possibility of Schopenhauerian selflessness, and while it is also right that he says many things in a seemingly egoistic spirit, Nietzsche's image of the great individual is not always as a user-and-abuser, concerned just with his own well-being, the rest of society be damned. Another image of human greatness that he gives is of the "mature" "collective individual," referred to in Human, All-too-Human (I:94). Such a person works, in certain ways, for the good of his or her fellow humans, but also does what is most to his or her advantage at the same time. Christine Swanton aptly draws attention to this neglected image of human greatness from Nietzsche. Such a figure, she argues, provides a way of bringing together the communitarian and individualist strands in Nietzsche's thinking and showing them to be reconcilable.

Rather than considering the question of whether Nietzsche puts more stock in the individual or the community, John Richardson focuses on what sort of relation between the two Nietzsche favors. A central strand in Nietzsche's thinking makes this out to be an antagonistic relation, in which the individual struggles to preserve her individuality in the face of pressures from the community (214). But Nietzsche, on Richardson's account, also recognizes the value of "the common" (233). Language is central to this story. It is a necessary instrument for the highly developed human creatures that we are, and it is something that is possible only within a community of people. Although language threatens to "make common" in a sense that is problematic or pernicious, it is also the key medium through which cultural change can be effected (242).

In style, Jeff Malpas's contribution was least like the others, having a more recognizably "continental" approach. The notion of landscape serves as Malpas's dominant metaphor and formed the centerpiece of a "topographical" (196) reading of Nietzsche. This notion of the topographical functions on both a literal and a metaphorical level. On the literal level, Malpas is concerned with the way in which Nietzsche's thought is intertwined with particular places. Sils Maria, Genoa, Turin -- these figure vividly in Nietzsche's writings, where one gets a palpable sense of his experience of them. On the metaphorical level, the idea seems to be that Nietzsche is a sort of peripatetic in thought: he is less interested in staking out a determinate position then he is in opening up a landscape of potential views.

20th century history, in particular the rise of National Socialism in Germany, has tainted many of these collectivist themes in Nietzsche's thought and has made his putative politics an object of considerable suspicion. But as Hans Sluga suggests, Nietzsche is more interesting as a diagnostician of political crisis than the "standard-bearer" (31) of a new politics. Sluga develops Nietzsche's remarks about the rise of democracy and the related disintegration of the political order from the classical state to the democratic state of the modern era. The heart of Nietzsche's politics, on this reading, is more descriptive than prescriptive.

But, politics aside, even Nietzsche's social philosophy has long been under a cloud of suspicion, some earned and some unearned. The volume is a testament to the fact that there is now a strong research program connected with these themes of community and culture in Nietzsche. The strongest essays in Young's volume contribute to this nascent debate and pave the way for future work on these and other related issues.