Need to Know: Vocation as the Heart of Christian Epistemology

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John G. Stackhouse, Jr., Need to Know: Vocation as the Heart of Christian Epistemology, Oxford University Press, 2014, 265pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199790647.

Reviewed by Clifford Williams, Wheaton College (IL)


Stackhouse describes his book as "general epistemology," by which he means that it covers a wide array of topics in epistemology. It does, indeed. The book begins with a description of the current situation in epistemology, with descriptions of three senses of pluralism and four cognitive styles: the enlightenment mentality, romanticism, a process approach, and the postmodern mentality. It moves to the vocation motif -- what humans were created to do with their lives and, specifically, what Christians are to be doing with their lives. The book's basic idea is captured in the phrase, "vocational epistemology": because God means for us to fulfill our vocations, God will see to it that we know enough to do so. After explaining this idea, Stackhouse gives accounts of five resources that can be used to fulfill our vocations -- experience, tradition, scholarship, art, and scripture -- along with three modes of apprehension -- intuition, imagination, and reason. In the remainder of the book he treats a number of other issues in epistemology, including the authority of the Bible, the social context of our thinking, and the principle of proportionate assent.

Stackhouse critiques a number of people: Protestant conservatives who declare, "The Bible says it; I believe it; that settles it" (242), those who compartmentalize by pursuing narrow aims, such as Christian politicians whose only aim is "the achievement of their party's platform and its perpetuation in power" (5), social constructivists, romanticists, and wholesale skeptics. At the same time, he appreciates insights in many of the views he critiques.

This appreciation of insights from different sources, along with Stackhouse's treatments of the five resources for fulfilling our vocation and the three modes of apprehension, mirrors the complexity involved in human knowing. Stackhouse's readers will feel this complexity by the time they finish the book.

Though he devotes only two pages to art -- one of the five resources for fulfilling our vocation -- Stackhouse has illuminating things to say about its connection to knowing. "Art suggests," he says, "and suggestions are helpful in a way that sheer facts, or widely agreed interpretation, or tightly constructed arguments are not" (110). Because art -- paintings, novels, poems, sculpture -- embody fresh perspectives on reality and new ways of seeing things, it "positions us in unusual angles of vision, heightens our awareness, removes what Coleridge called 'the film of familiarity' from our perception, opens up new landscapes, spotlights relations, poses alternatives, introduces possibilities" (111).

These ideas about the role of art in knowing suggest that Stackhouse does not regard justification or warrant as the only task of epistemology. His book, in fact, might aptly be described as being about "the knowing life," broadly construed as "what we can do to increase our fund of knowing," rather than solely about "how we can be sure we know what we think we know." As such, its aim is wider than that of a good deal of current professional epistemology. As Stackhouse notes, "One has to page through a lot of discussions of epistemology to find art even mentioned as a relevant resource" (110). This is because epistemology is not usually concerned with what Stackhouse is calling "resources," but largely with issues of justification and warrant. Some readers, no doubt, will be frustrated by his approach, whereas others will welcome it. The former will not regard him as always doing epistemology, and the latter will regard his accounts of the knowing life as revealing and insightful. I found myself in each camp to a degree -- sometimes wanting more on justification, yet appreciating Stackhouse's numerous insights.

Some of these insights may seem to be simply a matter of common sense  One example, from the section on experience, is: "reduced contact with, and interest in, the sensual experiences of life cannot help but reduce our field of perception, and therefore cannot help but reduce the accuracy, power, and faithfulness of our thinking in at least some crucial respects" (97). Another example comes feom the section on imagination: "The cultivation of a bold imagination that is both free and equipped to wander widely while also remaining in productive contact with the matter at hand is a crucial desideratum of serious thought" (134). Still, Stackhouse's statements are significant even though they might be thought obvious, for, if followed, people would have better "knowing lives," indeed, better lives overall. And not everyone is comfortable with these two pronouncements, as he notes: "the cultivation of a bold imagination, one might observe, has not everywhere and always been highly prized among Christians" (134). One can also imagine Christian critics of his first declaration about acquiring large amounts of sensual experiences.

Other insights that readers may appreciate include Stackhouse's remark that a hermeneutic of suspicion needs to be balanced with a "hermeneutics of love" (189), that "knowledge making is always political" (192), and that beliefs are contained in "webs" -- in "constellations" of beliefs (156, 161). He says this last fact means that: "disagreements are not always over particular propositions A or B, but over entire complexes of ideas, whole models of explanations that in turn reside within worldviews" (160). And this fact, in turn, means that knowing "is not simply a matter of 'S-knows-that-p,' the classic formulation in analytical philosophy" (160), and that sometimes people "may literally talk past each other" when disagreeing about a particular claim (161).

Although large swaths of the book contain perceptive and discerning discussions, several topics need to have been dealt with in more depth. One is Stackhouse's critiques of virtue epistemology, which are limited to a footnote on page 228. To those who are acquainted with virtue epistemology, several of his critiques will seem off the mark. And the main critique will seem irrelevant to the book's task of describing resources or means by which we can enhance the knowing life. Stackhouse's main critique appears to be that living virtuously ("striving . . . to be morally right persons") is a "useful approximation of what it means to be vocationally faithful," and "vocation, rather than virtue, is much the preferable way to understand Christian life" (228n53). However, if living virtuously is part of what it means to be vocationally faithful, then it is appropriate, necessary even, to say something about the virtues in an adequate epistemology. The book would have been richer with at least some treatment of the way in which virtues contribute to knowing.

To be fair to Stackhouse, I must point out that he does say things that get close to virtue epistemology. He says that "healthy spiritual disciplines can aid us greatly in our thinking" (226). The "spiritual disciplines . . . keep us walking with God aright" (225). In these remarks we have one of the key intuitions of virtue epistemology: knowing is enhanced when one has certain virtues. Moreover, Stackhouse seems to be presupposing throughout that the justification issue is answered by "how" assertions, that is, that we can know that our beliefs are more likely to be justified when we engage in certain practices and avail ourselves of the resources he describes. This, too, is a key feature of virtue epistemology. So even though Stackhouse says that he does not align with virtue epistemology, he does actually employ it to an extent.

Those who would like to have seen Stackhouse say more about justification and warrant will say that he needs an explanation of how he knows that certain practices are more likely to produce justified beliefs without begging the question. Stackhouse, however, is right to notice that many contemporary epistemologists agree that they cannot prove their bottom-line claims without presupposing the truth of the claim they want to prove: the reliability of memory, for instance, cannot be shown without presupposing memory's reliability (95). Perhaps Stackhouse's presupposition that the justification issue is answered by "how" assertions is one of these bottom-line claims. Or perhaps it is embedded near the bottom, or center, of a "Christian web of beliefs."

A further theme that needs more attention is Stackhouse's assertion, made several times in scattered places, that we need to rely on the Holy Spirit: one must listen to "what the Spirit of the Lord is saying today in and to the church" (105). One should not "miss the crucial element of existential reliance on the Holy Spirit to guide one's thinking in every moment" (228n53). We are not told, though, how we know when the Holy Spirit is guiding us. Is the Holy Spirit's guidance known by the presence of a feeling, an intuition, or perhaps even an Edwardsian "simple sense"? Without answers, the reader wonders whether this Holy Spirit epistemology can be excised without detracting from the sufficiency or completeness of the epistemology.

A last theme that needs more attention is the vocational epistemology that promises "God's sufficient provision for the basic calling of every Christian" (242). This calling involves the "primal commandments to love God, love our neighbors, and love the rest of Creation" (71). That is, if God calls us to live in certain ways, then God will see to it that we possess the knowledge that is required to fulfill that call. Stackhouse's inference from this central claim is that we can be confident that we actually do have knowledge "of the world."

Although his vocational epistemology is a creative response to skepticism and a distinctively Christian context for discussing knowledge (which some readers will applaud), Stackhouse needs to have addressed the following questions. What about people who are not Christians -- do not the first four of the resources he discusses (experience, tradition, scholarship, art) and the modes of apprehension (intuition, imagination, reason) give them knowledge as well? If people who are not Christians acquire knowledge through these resources and modes of apprehension, then what use is the appeal to vocation? Is there such a thing as Christian epistemology?

In addition, there are questions about the justification of the central claim: If God's having a vocation for us supports the reliability of these resources and modes of apprehension, what supports the reliability of God's having a vocation for us? How can circularity be avoided here? Or is there only a pragmatic justification for his central claim, as Stackhouse hints when he says, "I understand God to be pragmatically doing what needs to be done for the achievement of his own great purposes" (84)?

In spite of these questions that need more attention, I found Stackhouse's vocational epistemology intriguing, perhaps even promising. I also found the book eminently readable. Those who are new to epistemology will find it accessible and enlightening, and those who are familiar with epistemology will find distinctive issues with which to grapple.