Neo-Aristotelian Perspectives in Metaphysics

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Daniel D. Novotný and Lukáš Novák (eds.), Neo-Aristotelian Perspectives in Metaphysics, Routledge, 2014, 342pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415709392.

Reviewed by Phil Corkum, University of Alberta


In their introduction to this volume of invited essays, the editors write that they are "motivated by the observation that there is a neo-Aristotelian momentum in analytic metaphysics, which deserves to be reflected systematically" (p. 13). Themes in contemporary metaphysics that bear similarity to the interests, commitments, positions and general approaches found in Aristotle and the scholastic tradition are of current interest, and this volume is a welcome addition to such recent work in this vein as many of the essays in Tahko 2012, Correia and Schnieder 2012, Marmodoro 2013 and Schnieder, Steinberg and Hoeltje 2013.

I doubt if there's much information beyond these thematic similarities to be extracted from the label 'neo-Aristotelianism'. Contemporary metaphysicians who might be so classified tend towards positions reminiscent of Aristotelian metaphysics -- such as sympathy with grounding, substance ontology, non-modal construals of essence, hylomorphism, causal powers, presentism, endurantism and agent causation. However, prima facie it seems that one might hold any one of these positions while rejecting the others.

What perhaps unifies a neo-Aristotelian approach in metaphysics then is not a shared collection of positions so much as a willingness to engage with Aristotle and scholastics, and to view these historical figures as providing a fruitful way of framing certain philosophical issues. For this reason, neo-Aristotelians would benefit from drawing on the skill-set of the historian of philosophy. Most of the authors of this volume make historical claims and, although there are exceptions, the historical claims in the volume are generally not well supported. Careful scholarship would improve the accuracy. But historical scholarship is useful within contemporary metaphysics not merely to defend ascriptions of views to historical figures or to apply historically accurate labels to positions. Serious engagement with the history of philosophy can yield philosophical rewards. I give a few examples below where living metaphysical issues dovetail with questions of historical interpretation.

The editors purport to give a systematic representation of neo-Aristotelianism by loosely organizing the essays around the sequence of chapters in Suárez's Disputationes Metaphysicae. I'm not confident that this organization is entirely successful at presenting systematically a unified philosophical tradition -- or even whether such systematicity is especially desirable. The volume might better be seen as a collection of essays sharing the approach described above. The contributed chapters vary in quality. I shall discuss in detail a only a selection. To summarize the chapters I do not further discuss: Edward Feser defends an Aristotelian association of being and goodness from the charge that such associations commit the naturalistic fallacy. Gyula Klima argues that we must cognize non-existents through representations. Michael Loux discusses the underived source of the character of particulars. Edmund Runggaldier argues that agent causation is not limited to personal agents. Uwe Meixner discusses immaterial objects. Robert Koons discusses the ontological argument. Nicholas Rescher argues that one can speak of non-existents generally but not specifically.

Jorge Gracia motivates criteria for identifying the subject-matter of metaphysics and argues that categories of predicables satisfy the criteria. The article is ambitious, but I find its argument at times unclear. For example, Gracia's first criterion is that "the object of metaphysics must include everything" (p. 33), yet since individuals are impredicable they would seem to fail to meet this criterion; Gracia's response is that "this poses no difficulty to the extent that any knowledge we have of individuals must always be cast in terms of predicates" (p. 35). The claim that knowledge of individuals is predicative is left undefended, is not obviously true -- for example, what of acquaintance by demonstration? -- and were the claim true, it is unclear to me how the observation responds to the objection that a theory of predicables fails to satisfy Gracia's first criterion. The interpretation of Aristotle's categories is delicate and the exegetical issues may be of use to Gracia, since Aristotle's categories are arguably presented in the Categories as exhaustive, have been interpreted as kinds of predicates, yet include individuals in all categories. For discussion of individuals in categories other than substance, see Corkum 2009.

William Vallicella argues against ontological monism and endorses the view that there are modes of existence. I worry that his argument conflates ontological monism with the view that existence is a property. In arguing against ontologically thin theorists such as Peter van Inwagen, Vallicella notes that to deny that existence is a property of objects is not to endorse the Fregean view that it is a second order property. Vallicella rejects the view that existence is a property altogether since he views the position as circular. He appears to hold that the only alternative to the position that existence is a first or second order property is ontological pluralism. But another option for the ontological monist is the Quinean view that to exist is to be in the domain of the quantifiers. Vallicella dismisses this position since he takes the view to be that existence is a general concept common to existents and so violates the thesis that the existence of one particular is distinct from the existence of another particular. But one can view existence as tied to quantifier domains without thereby taking existence to be a property.

Vallicella suggests a few uses for the view that there are modes of existence: for example, one might distinguish a composite such as a clay statue from its material composition by ascribing different modes of existence to each; the statue exists in one way, and the clay in another. However, Vallicella neither develops such suggestions nor explains how we are to think of a mode of existence. As such, it is difficult to assess his proposal. He presumably would be unsympathetic to recent ontological pluralists, such as McDaniel (2009) and Turner (2010), who appeal to distinct quantifier domains. Both Kris McDaniel and Jason Turner cite Aristotle's multivocity as a historical precedent for the view. Aristotle's claim that being is not a genus at 998b22 and elsewhere also may suggest that the categories yield distinct quantifier domains.

The late E. J. Lowe's contribution is brief at under eight pages, but it exhibits the clarity and fecundity characteristic of Lowe's best writing. Lowe holds that there are both unity and identity requirements for individuality. An individual determinately counts as one entity and so falls under a sortal, which provides criteria for enumeration. An individual also has a determinate identity -- both in the sense of instantiating a reflexive relation that adheres to the principle of the indiscernibility of identicals, and in the sense of possessing a nature or individual essence. These features of countability and identity can come apart.

Some entities have determinate countability criteria while lacking determinate identity conditions. For example, the orbital electrons of a helium atom are distinct and count as two, yet there is no fact of the matter that is spin-up or that is spin-down. Lowe calls such entities 'quasi-individuals'.

Other entities have determinate natures or identities, while lacking determinate countability conditions. Lowe calls these entities 'pseudo-individuals'. For example, a material stuff like (let us assume) water has a nature yet lacks a unit of enumeration. In defense of this claim, Lowe notes that we can say that the water once in the bathtub is now in the Thames. In this bathwater example, Lowe seems to be taking individual essences as providing conditions sufficient for re-identification over time. This distinction between sortal terms such as 'human', which provide both criteria of enumeration and criteria of identification, and those such as 'water', which provide only the latter, will be familiar to readers of Lowe from, for example, Lowe 2009, 14. Other than the introduction of the bathwater case, Lowe does not provide new support for his view. And it is unclear to me that criteria of enumeration can be disentangled from criteria of identification and reidentification. To continue with the bathwater case, we arguably identify the water only under some sortal that allows enumeration -- a bathtub full of water -- and then pick out that very water (or a part of that water) as being now distributed in the Thames.

David Oderberg discusses Koslicki's (2008) characterization of the distinction between structure and content as a kind of hylomorphism.

Oderberg holds that, for any given material substance, there is a unique hylomorphic breakdown of that substance into its species form and prime matter. Some Aristotelians hold that Aristotle is committed at 1029a12-27 and elsewhere to prime matter, a material lacking any determinate feature. In contrast, Oderberg holds that, for any given material substance, there is a variety of analyses of that substance into structure and content. One of Oderberg's (p. 171) examples is that a water molecule has a structure involving two hydrogen atoms and one oxygen atom; but it also has a distinct structure involving twenty-eight up quarks, twenty-six down quarks and ten electrons. So Oderberg concludes that Kathrin Koslicki's structure-content distinction is distinct from the Aristotelian form-matter distinction, and that the latter is better suited for characterizing material substances.

Some Aristotelians agree with Oderberg that a material substance has a unique form-matter analysis. However, I doubt that Aristotle himself holds this view; rather, he allows that there are a variety of distinct hylomorphic analyses. The proximate matter of an individual substance itself has a distinctive form and a matter. Although a human is materially flesh (let us say), for Aristotle flesh is itself a kind of earth; earth is then a distal matter for humans. I discuss the matter-form relation in Aristotle in Corkum 2013b. Aristotle appears to hold at 1044b1-2 that the breakdown of a substance into its peculiar form and proximate matter best characterizes that substance. But Oderberg gives no reason to believe that there could not be likewise more and less appropriate ways to characterize the structure and content of a thing.

I do not claim that Koslicki views structure in this way. Her view might be characterized as hylomorphic, not because structure and content map perfectly onto Aristotle's form and matter, but because (arguably like Aristotle) she views ordinary objects as compounds mereologically composed of both material parts and a structural or formal part. For this reason, there can be two distinct wholes with all and only the same material parts: the motorcycle differs in its parts when assembled and disassembled, for the arrangement of its material parts is itself a part of the whole.

Michael Gorman discusses the Aristotelian distinction between essential and accidental features. He rejects accounts of essence proposed by Fine (1994) and others, and argues that essential properties are possessed fundamentally while the possession of accidental properties are supported by other features. Support for Gorman is the converse of the partly because relation: if a is F at least partly because b is G, then b's being G supports a's being F. Gorman holds that support is an irreflexive, transitive and well-founded relation. As Gorman (p. 134, n. 1) acknowledges, support is similar to grounding, a non-causal relation of metaphysical explanation discussed by Schaffer (2009) and many others.

Gorman quickly rejects alternative proposals of a non-modal construal of essence. For example, he rejects Fine's proposal that the essence of a thing is its identity and corresponds to a real definition. Gorman appears to view definitions as being interest-dependent, as well as being more obscure than, and explanatorily posterior, to essences. But it is unclear to me why a 'real' definition would not be interest-independent.

Gorman's proposal arguably sheds light on accidental properties, but essential features are left underexplained. Part of the appeal of Kit Fine's proposal is that the fact that essences ground accidents is itself explained by the relation between essences and real definitions. An account of an accidental property makes reference to what kind of thing can possess such properties. For example, an account of a proprium like risibility or an accident like generosity would make reference to the essential rationality of risible or generous humans. I discuss the relation between fundamental and derivative elements of Aristotle's ontology in Corkum 2008. Peramatzis (2011) offers an interpretation of Aristotle along Finean lines; for discussion see Corkum 2013a and 2013b.

Two authors discuss the philosophy of mathematics. James Franklin applies Aristotle's discussion of quantity to issues in the philosophy of mathematics; the result is a view akin to literalism, the position that mathematical objects exist in the perceivable world. William Lane Craig sees a challenge to God's exclusive aseity in mathematical platonism, and responds by advocating mathematical fictionalism; Craig's wide-ranging rehearsal of technical issues, however, gives little new reason to support fictionalism. Aristotle's own view of mathematical objects is complex, and issues of interpretation may prove useful to both Franklin and Craig. Aristotle's position resembles literalism in some respects and so might provide historical precedent for Franklin's approach. However, Aristotle does not believe that mathematicians study quantitative properties of perceivable substances as such. Aristotle's view resembles fictionalism in other respects and so might provide historical precedent for Craig's approach. However, unlike contemporary fictionalists, Aristotle holds that mathematics is true. I discuss Aristotle's philosophy of mathematics in Corkum 2012.


Corkum, P. 2008 "Aristotle on Ontological Dependence." Phronesis 53: 65-92.

Corkum, P. 2009 "Aristotle on Nonsubstantial Individuals." Ancient Philosophy 29: 289-310.

Corkum, P. 2012 "Aristotle on Mathematical Truth." British Journal for the History of Philosophy 20: 1057-76.

Corkum, P. 2013a "Substance and Independence in Aristotle" in Schnieder, Steinberg and Hoeltje 2013. Pp. 36-67.

Corkum, P. 2013b "Critical Notice of Michail Peramatzis, Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2011." Canadian Journal of Philosophy 43: 136-56.

Correia, F. and B. Schnieder, eds. 2012 Metaphysical Grounding: Understanding the Structure of Reality. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Fine, K. 1994 "Essence and Modality" in Philosophical Perspectives VIII: Logic and Language. Ed. J. Tomberlin. Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview. Pp. 1-16.

Koslicki, K. 2008 The Structure of Objects. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Lowe, E. J. 2009 More Kinds of Being: A Further Study of Individuation, Identity, and the Logic of Sortal Terms. Oxford: Wiley-Blackwell.

Marmodoro, A., ed. 2013 The Metaphysics of Powers: Their Grounding and Their Manifestations. New York: Routledge.

McDaniel, K. 2009 "Ways of Being" in Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology. Eds. D. Manley, D. Chalmers and R. Wasserman. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Peramatzis, M. 2011 Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schaffer, J. 2009 "On What Grounds What" in Metametaphysics: New Essays on the Foundations of Ontology. Eds. D. Chalmers, D. Manley, and R. Wasserman. Oxford: Oxford University Press. Pp. 347-83.

Schnieder, B., A. Steinberg and M. Hoeltje 2013 eds. Varieties of Dependence, Basic Philosophical Concepts Series, Philosophia Verlag (Munich).

Tahko, T., ed. 2012 Contemporary Aristotelian Metaphysics. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Turner, J. 2010 "Ontological Pluralism" Journal of Philosophy 107: 5-34.