Neo-Davidsonian Metaphysics: From the True to the Good

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Samuel C. Wheeler III, Neo-Davidsonian Metaphysics: From the True to the Good, Routledge, 2014, 239pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415857284.

Reviewed by Zoltán Gendler Szabó, Yale University


Metaphysics has always been suffused with self-doubt. The idea that we can find out important things about the fundamental nature of reality by thinking hard as we walk around the agora or sit by the fire in the study has struck many as wishful thinking. With Hume and Kant, anti-metaphysical attitudes in philosophy went mainstream; with Wittgenstein and Quine, they became dominant. What kept metaphysics alive amidst the skeptical, critical, therapeutic, and pragmatic assaults was uncertainty about what exactly is supposed to be wrong with it: serious attempts to diagnose the error tend to lead to just more metaphysics. Lately, philosophers of anti-metaphysical bent have started to acknowledge that what they do is metaphysics (and, consequently, to suggest that not all metaphysics is confusion, hubris, nonsense, or propaganda), albeit, to use Strawson's term, a descriptive, not a revisionary kind. Metaphysics, done in this fashion, is supposed to forfeit the right to supplant or alter what we already take for granted in our unreflective moments.

Davidson's program -- as Samuel Wheeler reconstructs it in this book -- is anti-metaphysical in just this way (135). Davidson's writings pose substantial interpretative challenges: he painted with broad brushstrokes, he never wrote a magnum opus, and he reformulated his central theses in numerous non-equivalent ways. Wheeler stays clear of philology and opts for a bold reconstruction instead. He calls the result "neo-Davidsonian" to stress the many ways in which it goes against views Davidson explicitly advocated. Thus, while the actual Davidson is at best equivocal on the question of whether properties and propositions exist and -- taking the Slingshot Argument to heart (215) -- is committed to there being at most one fact, Wheeler's neo-Davidsonians side with common sense and accept such entities in their ontology. While the actual Davidson is a monist, arguing that particular mental events are identical to physical events, Wheeler's neo-Davidsonians are dualists, maintaining that, despite sharing all their causes and effects, mental events and their physical correlates are distinct. This particular disagreement is due to a broader one about event-individuation, which in turn is the result of a different stance on de re necessities: while the actual Davidson appears to reject them, Wheeler's neo-Davidsonians embrace them, at least in a relative form. Despite the differences, Wheeler's reconstruction seems true to the spirit of Davidson's philosophy, and most of the time the reader comes away with the feeling that this is exactly what Davidson should have said.

Neo-Davidsonian metaphysics rests on four tenets, none of which concerns directly reality as such -- they are principles about how we make sense of each other. First, there is the principle of charity -- the thesis that most of what we believe is true. This isn't supposed to be so because we are wise, well-informed, or attuned to the world, but rather because what we believe is determined by interpretation, because we cannot interpret another without taking her to be rational, and because ascribing massive error is incompatible with that assumption. Second, there is the rejection of absolute identity -- the idea that sameness is always relative. When we posit something we posit it as falling under some predicate, and this predicate settles what its identity-conditions are. The world is the world of posits, not of bare existences -- reality isn't carved up into distinct entities independent of our way of conceptualizing them. Third, there is the commitment to the primacy of truth -- the view that there is no test for adequacy of interpretation of someone's idiolect beyond getting the truth-conditions of its sentences right. Reference and satisfaction are then merely instrumental notions employed in the service of a theory of truth. And finally, there is the denial of lexical decomposition -- where this denial is understood as the constraint that syntactically simple expressions should be interpreted via other syntactically simple expressions. This makes homophonic clauses the rule and casts serious doubt on providing an interpretative semantic theory for a sufficiently different language. Wheeler reminds us of Saussure's example of the French 'mouton' which, unlike the English 'mutton' or 'sheep,' covers both the meat and the animal (119). Without decomposition, there is no way to give satisfaction-conditions for 'mouton' in English.

The first plank of the program guarantees that no metaphysics stated in ordinary language will hold big surprises, the second undercuts the possibility of providing an inventory of reality once and for all, the third denies the possibility of providing substantive theories of reference that might support claims about what in the world makes our sentences true, and the fourth eliminates analysis as a distinctive philosophical method. We are left with a very generous ontology -- it contains everything whose existence follows by ordinary lights from the sorts of things we ordinarily believe, including properties, propositions, facts, events, possibilities, numbers, values, holes and shadows. (Also, presumably, Humpty Dumpty -- given the fact that 'Humpty Dumpty is a literary character invented by Lewis Carroll' is a true sentence that could not be true unless there was this thing -- Humpty Dumpty -- that is a literary character.)

But the metaphysics that goes with this ontology is completely flat -- it denies all hierarchy among existences. "Some posits are useful for science, some for art, some for industry, and some for personal relations. But there is no clear sense Davidson can give to the question that predicates pick out the real Beings." (24) Moreover, the entities posited play no substantive explanatory role. For example, we don't need the property of being white or the fact that snow is white to account for the truth of 'Snow is white'. The only explanation for this truth comes from optics and chemistry. We posit the property of being white or the fact that snow is white not because they are indispensable for the semantics of predication -- they are not! -- but because we think 'Snow has the property of being white' and 'It is a fact that snow is white' are true sentences, and we believe they entail that these entities exist. That is all there is to it.

This is undoubtedly an anti-realist metaphysics, but not one that regards the world as created by language. Homophonic semantic clauses specify worldly conditions -- what it takes for something to satisfy the predicate 'is a tyrannosaur' is to be a tyrannosaur, not to be related in some way to some bit of language. Whether tyrannosaurs exist, and if so, what they are does not depend on whether there are words, and if so, what they mean. 'There were tyrannosaurs in 67 million BCE' is true, it was already true long before the sentence itself existed and it will remain true long after the sentence is no longer (120). The world is not a projection of our speech. At the same time, it is fair to characterize Davidson's view as denying the possibility of factoring the world into something given to us and something contributed by us.

Should we believe the four Davidsonian tenets, which lead to this lightweight metaphysics? I do have my reservations. Take the principle of charity: while it is plausible that in interpreting each other we must assume some agreement, it is not clear that the agreement must be particularly expansive, and even less clear that it should rule out acknowledgment of massive error. A lot of what we say might be literally false and still be used to convey obliquely truths we could only express with great difficulty or not at all. Or take absolute identity: in the end, it is very hard to dispense with it. Even if ordinary proper names, demonstratives, and pure indexicals refer via some predicate or other (71-74), variables, by their very nature, do not. This fact strongly suggests that the sentence 'xy¬(x=y)' expresses absolute distinctness. One might suggest that its proper interpretation requires relativization of '=' to a predicate whose extension is the entire domain, but given the fact that we don't seem to conceptualize reality as such, a neo-Davidsonian should be wary of making such a move. And opting for the primacy of truth leads directly to a radical form of indeterminacy. We know from Putnam's model-theoretic argument how easy it is to switch around reference-clauses and satisfaction-clauses in a semantic theory while keeping all truth-clauses fixed -- but the idea that the resulting theories are no worse than the original ones is very hard to believe. Responses to this problem have generally evoked a causal constraint or reference-magnetism, but both of these are explicitly repudiated by neo-Davidsonians (22).

Unlike the first three, the last plank of the neo-Davidsonian view -- the denial of lexical decomposition -- enjoys widespread approval today. What led to the waning popularity of analysis were not sophisticated arguments but stubborn lack of success. Our favorite analyses all have counterexamples, and when we fix them new counterexamples emerge. It's not that substantive necessary and sufficient conditions for satisfying an ordinary predicate are rare. You can look up in the dictionary that acid is a chemical compound that, when dissolved in water, gives a solution with a pH less than 7.0. But this is due to a combination of scientific discovery and carefully calibrated stipulation, and is not discoverable through reflection and thought experiments.

Still, I don't think semantics should eschew analysis completely. Davidson's most famous semantic insight was that action sentences quantify over underlying events. The argument is based on the claim that the inference from 'John buttered the toast in my kitchen' to 'John buttered the toast' is logically valid, and the claim that the best way to account for this fact is to ascribe to the former sentence the logical form 'e (buttered (j, t, e)  in my kitchen (e))' and to the latter the logical form 'e (buttered (j, t, e)).' By contrast, Davidson does not think semantics should account for the validity of the inference from 'John buttered the toast' to 'John was able to butter the toast'. Why not? Because it depends on the interpretation of 'was able to' -- replace it with 'was happy to' and the inference becomes invalid. By contrast, the former inference has nothing to do with the interpretation of any expression -- replace 'John buttered the toast' with any other clause both in the premise and the conclusion, and replace 'in my kitchen' in the premise with a wide variety of prepositional phrases, and the validity of the inference is unaffected. (Of course, there are prepositional phrases that destroy validity: 'John buttered the toast in my dream' does not entail 'John buttered the toast'. Neo-Davidsonians must explain why 'in my kitchen' contributes differently to logical form than 'in my dream,' but in this project, grammar is not on their side. But let's assume the problem can be solved.)

So far so good, but what should we say about the entailment from 'John buttered at least two toasts' to 'John buttered at least one toast'? On the one hand, it seems clearly logically valid; on the other hand its validity clearly depends on the interpretation of 'at least two' and 'at least one'. Davidson would presumably respond that these are logical constants -- but then we should wonder how he knows that 'was able to' is not a logical constant. Davidson suggests that "The logical constants may be identified as those iterative features of the language that require a recursive clause in the characterization of truth or satisfaction" ('In Defence of Convention T', Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, 1984, 71). But there are no words that must be given a recursive clause. Semantic theories that work with a type-theory tend to operate with only a handful of recursive clauses and for the simplest fragments of natural languages they allow but a single recursive clause -- function application. In these semantic theories you get to assign a particular semantic value to 'not', 'and', 'or', 'every', 'some', etc. Davidson holds on to recursive clauses for each of these items simply because he is sticking to first-order resources in semantics. But this is ad hoc -- why say that 'at least seventeen but no more than twenty-five' is a logical constant but 'most' is not?

When Davidson decides to treat a word as a logical constant, he gives it a separate semantic clause, which delivers a semantic analysis. (It's true that the semantic clauses for 'not' or 'every' are not a full-blown analyses, since they use the translation of these words to the meta-language. They are partial analyses that link the interpretation of these words with truth and satisfaction.) Wheeler is more principled than Davidson in sticking to disquotation. His semantic account of 'Fred is taller than Joe' is, roughly, that the ordered pair of Fred's tallness and Joe's tallness satisfies '- er . . . than' (170). The semantics of the comparative morpheme is strictly disquotational -- the fact that the morpheme expresses a linear order is part of the theory, not part of the interpretation. In a similar vein, Wheeler distinguishes sharply the semantics of '- ed' and 'will', both of which are disquotational, from the theory of tense, which for him is a conception of the passage of time involving the elimination of physical possibilities (138). Wheeler even entertains the idea that a neo-Davidsonian might give disquotational clauses for the quantifiers. He writes:

"Five frogs are green" would be "five(x|Fx, x|Gx)." "Not all frogs are green" and "It is not the case that some frogs are not green" would be "¬A(x|Fx, x|Gx)" and "S(x|Fx, x|¬Gx)." Prima facie, there is no more reason to build the equivalence between these two sentences into the semantics then there is to build arithmetic into 'five' in order to capture the equivalence between "five" and "twelve minus seven." Arithmetic is the theory that does that, and set theory is the theory that captures the equivalence between "All frogs are green" and "It is not the case that some frogs are not green." . . . On the modified Davidsonian conception of logic being described, the logical particles would be the truth-functions and the set-abstraction operator. (223n5).

But this still leaves 'Snow is white and grass is green; therefore snow is white' as analytic, and, as far as I can tell, once Wheeler comes this far there is no way to account for the validity of this entailment. Why not say that the validity of this entailment should be explained by the theory of truth-functions, not by semantics?

A semantic theory without any trace of analysis treats each and every lexical item as a semantic primitive. When it comes to the interpretation of words like 'milk,' or 'frog,' or 'run,' or 'help,' this is probably a good idea. For such a word a good lexicon will contain part of our best theory about what the word picks out -- what kind of stuff is milk, what frogs are, what it is to run, and what constitutes help. There is arguably no principled way to identify a core of these theories that any competent speaker must know. Semantics should probably stay out of the business of dictionary writing and restrict itself to disquotational clauses for these words. But the situation is different when it comes to function words, like 'if,' or 'always,' or 'would,' or 'ought'. These have lexical entries that tend to be uninformative (except for the sentences picked to illustrate how the words are used within sentences), and it is not clear that we should think of them as picking out some worldly item. Mathematicians may have a theory of comparison, and physicists may develop a theory of time, but these theories alone will never make contact with the English comparative and tense morphemes -- someone else will need to tell us what sort of comparison is expressed by '- er . . . than' and to what aspects of time we relate by '- ed' and 'will'. It seems to me that this is still a work for semanticists. And they do take it seriously; for better or worse, almost all of contemporary semantics is concerned with the interpretation of "little" words. In this, semantics has taken its lesson from Russell, whose most consequential analysis is not about knowledge, laws of nature, or moral obligation, but about the definite article.

I don't think the neo-Davidsonian program is a successful attempt to deflate metaphysics, and I don't even think that the semantic minimalism bolstering the attempt can stand. But I also don't think the value of a philosophical program is best measured by success in achieving its goals. Wheeler's book is invaluable in articulating and clearing up all sorts of confusions about Davidson's metaphysical views. It brings the view closer to the thinking of contemporary metaphysicians and semanticists by eliminating some of its inessential or refuted assumptions. In this way, it helps us focus on the heart of the challenge it poses for those of us who believe that metaphysics is for real and that it may even have something to do with meaning. Let the debate continue.