New Approaches to Neo-Kantianism

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Nicolas de Warren and Andrea Staiti (eds.), New Approaches to Neo-Kantianism, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 322pp., $102.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107032576.

Reviewed by Guido Kreis, Aarhus University


Neo-Kantianism appears to be back on the philosophical agenda. Several fresh attempts have recently been made to reassess the main ideas of the philosophical movement which dominated German universities in the late 19th and early 20th centuries but was almost completely forgotten for several decades. The renewed interest in Neo-Kantianism is not entirely unexpected, however. Contemporary philosophy has never completely lost contact to Kant, and several classic and current strands in analytic philosophy heavily draw on Kantian themes (think of P. F. Strawson, Robert Brandom, and John McDowell, to mention only the most obvious examples). On closer inspection the contemporary reception and development of Kant shows strong similarities to the way the Neo-Kantians tried to reformulate Kant's transcendental approach. Both attempts to advocate a Kantian turn in philosophy are situated in an intellectual landscape where the achievements of modern empirical science are commonly regarded as a serious challenge for developing philosophy as a self-standing scientific enterprise. It seems promising, then, to engage in the re-examination of the doctrines of more or less long forgotten figures like Hermann Cohen, Paul Natorp, Heinrich Rickert, and Ernst Cassirer. This new collection of fourteen papers aims to promote such a re-examination, and promises to offer "New Approaches to Neo-Kantianism." For reasons of space, I will only be able to discuss the texts which seemed most striking to me.

A very interesting new approach to Neo-Kantianism is indeed offered by Hans-Johann Glock (chapter 3). Glock wants to defend the suggestion "that Neo-Kantianism is relevant to analytic philosophy." (59) In doing so, he vehemently argues against well-established front lines and prejudices in 20th century philosophy. Glock points out that the impression of an irreconcilable opposition between Kantianism and analytic philosophy was originally suggested by three (at their time) dominant tendencies in analytic philosophy: the denial of synthetic a priori judgements in the Vienna Circle's logical positivism; the strict replacement of any attempt at a philosophical system by piecemeal investigations in Oxford conceptual analysis; and the rejection of any kind of non-naturalized epistemology by Quine and his followers (65). But Glock is right in emphasising that there have always also been quite different developments. For one thing, there is a longstanding tradition of anti-naturalism in analytic philosophy. Cohen, Natorp and Cassirer agreed both with Frege and Husserl on the central point that logic, mathematics and epistemology cannot possibly be reduced to the investigation of physical nature. Further, many logical positivists agreed with the Kantians that philosophy is indeed a "second-order discipline": "it articulates the conceptual scheme that science and common sense employ" (67). Wittgenstein's Tractatus, for instance, can legitimately be read as a specific variation of transcendental philosophy, as it aims at demarcating valid and invalid (meaningful and nonsensical) forms of judgement and discourse. This is of course not to imply that the logical positivists and the Neo-Kantians actually held the same set of philosophical beliefs. But it does mean that they shared a framework of basic assumptions about the nature and the task of philosophy. It is only with respect to this framework that the controversy between, for instance, Cassirer and the Vienna Circle begins to make sense.

Glock discusses the mutual historical influences and systematical similarities between Kantianism and analytic philosophy in more detail with the help of three illuminating case studies: the development of philosophy of science, and of a corresponding conception of philosophy as a second-order discipline, in Cohen, Cassirer, and the logical positivists (69‑72); the impact of Hermann Lotze and Otto Liebmann on Frege's philosophy (72‑7); and the (indeed striking) affinities between Frege and the Southwestern school of Neo-Kantianism, particularly Wilhelm Windelband and Rickert, with an emphasis on the notions of the validity and normativity of judgements, and of logic more generally (77‑80). Glock's very helpful paper is an important step towards a differentiated and undogmatic understanding of the relations between Kantianism and analytic philosophy, replacing longstanding prejudices and boundaries by the meticulous analysis of arguments, and pointing at several promising avenues for future research.

One of the most vividly discussed proponents of the Neo-Kantian movement is Cassirer. His philosophy of symbolic forms paradigmatically documents, in its encyclopedic scope, the remarkably broad range of the Neo-Kantian philosophical interests and topics. Massimo Ferrari (ch. 13) discusses in detail Cassirer's innovative achievements in the interpretation of modern science. Ferrari emphasizes how much Cassirer's approach owed to Cohen's original version of the Neo-Kantian 'transcendental method.' However, Cassirer's version of a Kantian theory of the categories did not attempt any kind of deduction of the categories from alleged transhistorical principles of human reasoning, as Ferrari points out. Rather, the categories are derived by way of analysis from the factual development of the modern empirical sciences. Ferrari discusses Cassirer's contribution to three major battlefields of his time: the debate over the foundations of mathematics in Dedekind, Frege, Russell, and others (268‑71), and the dispute concerning the appropriate interpretation of both Einstein's theory of relativity (272-7) and quantum physics (278‑83). With his philosophical analyses of these and related developments in science, Cassirer bound "the fate of critical philosophy to its relation to the development of the exact sciences" in a much stronger way than most other Neo-Kantians did (264). Cassirer did not, however, withdraw from transcendental philosophy at large. Rather, as Ferrari points out, Cassirer proposed a version of a "relativized a priori" (272), according to which the categories are historized to relatively stable invariants behind the actual development of science and culture.

As is well known, Cassirer in later years extended his version of transcendental philosophy to the realm of culture. De Warren gives a comprehensive sketch of the core idea of Cassirer's "phenomenology" of culture by distinguishing Cassirer from other representatives of phenomenology, particularly Husserl (ch. 4). Sebastian Luft draws a vivid portrait of the philosophy of symbolic forms by tracing its origins back to Cohen's Neo-Kantianism (ch. 11). Against a major trend in recent Cassirer scholarship, Luft compellingly argues that the philosophy of symbolic forms will remain incomprehensible as long as one doesn't take into account to what considerable extent its achievements are due to Cohen's version of the critical method as transcendental analysis. It is nevertheless legitimate to say that Cassirer's project of a critical analysis of the foundations of the various forms of human culture in symbolic functions reaches far beyond Cohen. But again, as Luft is ready to emphasize, Cassirer still advocates a transcendental approach even to culture, and thereby sharply demarcates his philosophy of symbolic forms from all versions of cultural relativism (234). Particularly helpful is Luft's comparison of Cassirer with Brandom's thoughts on the nature and status of philosophy (237‑9), and his metaphor of a "space of culture" (drawing on the familiar, related metaphor of a "space of reasons" invented by Wilfrid Sellars), which Luft has cashed out in more detail in his recent monograph on the Marburg philosophy of culture.[1] Luft provides a most welcome perspective for fruitfully developing and defending Cassirer's notion of philosophy in the context of contemporary debates.

A number of papers in the collection discuss issues in Neo-Kantian practical philosophy. Jonathan Trejo-Mathys' contribution on "Neo-Kantianism in the philosophy of law" (ch. 7) focusses on Rudolf Stammler, who is often regarded as the founder of Neo-Kantian philosophy of law, and his reception in Max Weber, Hans Kelsen, and Cohen. Trejo-Mathys sees close affinities here to the discourse theory of the late Frankfurt school (Habermas), pointing out that one of the main convictions of both movements is the claim "that sociality is unavoidably constituted by forms of normativity that are irreducible to instrumental rationality." (169) Christian Krijnen and Beatrice Centi both describe the Neo-Kantian movement in a more general fashion as a "theory of validity" (115), with Krijnen focussing on the implications of that account for the philosophy of culture (ch. 5), and Centi elaborating on the ethical theories of Cohen, Natorp, and Rickert (ch. 6). Both contributions try to develop their basic ideas immanently from their Neo-Kantian references. No attempt is made to discuss the issues of validity and values in the context of more recent debates about normativity and values. If the Neo-Kantian insights into the nature of normativity are still relevant, however, it would have been very helpful to see how they could possibly be clarified and defended in those debates. Peter E. Gordon's paper (ch. 10) on philosophy of religion since Kant, on the other hand, does extend the perspective from Kant to Rawls and Habermas, but is, with the exception of a short section on Cohen (207‑10), not much concerned with Neo-Kantianism.

The disregard for external and contemporary perspectives, and for the systematic issues they put on the agenda, might be a disadvantage at the end of the day. Staiti's paper on "The Neo-Kantians on the meaning and status of philosophy," which opens the volume, centres around the idea that philosophy is "the universal science of the world as a whole" (33); the main reference here is Rickert. However, every such determination of philosophy as a science of "the world as a whole" is obviously highly problematic, since the concept of the world leads, as Kant had already shown, to very serious paradoxes. Though he briefly mentions the cosmological antinomies (25), Staiti completely leaves aside whether the proposed definition of philosophy is at all consistent. However, there have been intensive debates over the concept of the world and over absolute totalities in the past decades[2] (in which Kantian positions have, at least partly, been discussed and even acknowledged[3]), in the light of which it seems highly likely that the concept of the world is indeed inconsistent. Moreover, Staiti seems to reanimate exactly that longstanding opposition of Kantianism and analytic philosophy against which Glock so vehemently argues in the same volume, e.g., when Staiti says that "the linguistic turn feels so unbearably narrow" (37), or when he considers the possibility that "philosophy produces only endless variations of physicalist reductionism." (ibid.) It is probably not sufficient to merely claim the superiority of Kantianism over and against some picture of analytic philosophy. The cautious defense with the help of better arguments seems to be the real challenge here.

Critical considerations aside, however, the present volume offers a number of interesting new perspectives on central topics from Neo-Kantian theoretical philosophy and philosophy of culture.

[1] Sebastian Luft, The Space of Culture: Towards a Neo-Kantian Philosophy of Culture (Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer), Oxford University Press, 2015.

[2] See, e.g., Patrick Grim, The Incomplete Universe, MIT Press, 1991, and Augustín Rayo, Gabriel Uzquiano (eds.), Absolute Generality, Oxford University Press, 2006.

[3] See, e.g., Adrian W. Moore, The Infinite, Routledge, 2nd edition, 2001, and Graham Priest, Beyond the Limits of Thought, Oxford University Press 2002.