New Essays on Leibniz's Theodicy

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Larry M. Jorgensen and Samuel Newlands (eds.), New Essays on Leibniz's Theodicy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 257pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199660032.

Reviewed by Paul Lodge, Mansfield College, University of Oxford


This collection is derived from the conference Leibniz's Theodicy: Context and Content, which was held on the 300th anniversary of the publication of the Theodicy at the University of Notre Dame in September 2010. Indeed, the original versions of many of the papers can still be viewed on the Notre Dame's Center for the Philosophy of Religion's YouTube page. The stated aim of the conference was to

explore [the Theodicy's] contents, its fit within the Leibnizian corpus, its broader historical context, and its subsequent reception and impact [and] also explore how the views expressed fit into the larger intellectual landscape of the period, standing as it does at crucial crossroads: the waning of the post-Reformation, the maturing of the scientific revolution, the dawning of the Enlightenment, and the maturing of the rationalist philosophical framework introduced in the early seventeenth century.

This also serves as an accurate general description of the present volume, which features versions of most of the papers that were delivered.

The volume comprises twelve essays and a short introduction by the editors. The contributors include a significant number of the most distinguished contemporary scholars writing about Leibniz, together with some younger authors. The introduction provides a short description of the background to, and historical reception of, the Theodicy as well as a brief account of each essay. The editors follow the convention of trying to point to common features that provide a rationale for the ordering of the essays. This perhaps proves a little strained, given that the essays are discrete, independently authored, and hence largely unconnected responses to the brief "re-examine Leibniz's Theodicy both in its intellectual context and its philosophical content" (p. 6). However, the volume is probably none the worse for this, given that it allows the authors the freedom to speak about things on which they have views rather than a prescribed topic.

One important theme in the introduction concerns the extent to which Leibniz's Theodicy, and the brand of perfectionist ethics that it grounds, have been sorely neglected by readers of Leibniz ever since the 18th century -- whether as a result of factors such as Voltaire's famous lampooning in Candide, Kant's dismissal of the very possibility of a theodicy, or (among Anglophones) Russell's rather pompous and fatuous account of these aspects of Leibniz's thought in his History of Western Philosophy and the more benign neglect that we find in the popular English-language anthologies of Leibniz's writings. A proper appraisal of Leibniz as a philosopher requires that we treat the Theodicy and the themes contained in it with the centrality that Leibniz himself seems to have accorded them. And there is good reason to think that this volume will encourage more people to step into the often murky waters that are found in Leibniz's only published book. For that alone, we should be grateful.

The volume proper begins with "Prefacing the Theodicy," in which Christia Mercer makes a plea for paying close attention to the Theodicy's preface. Mercer emphasizes the importance of the preface as an advertisement for the way in which Leibniz's book is a series of attempts (as the word Essais in the full title of the Theodicy suggests) at offering a recipe for a "radical rationalist" approach to acquiring the virtue of piety that should be available independently of allegiance to any particular religion. Mercer provides an important corrective for readers of the Theodicy who might expect to find themselves encountering a work of Christian apologetics. But she also includes an interesting discussion of the essai as a form of writing and an invitation to think harder about how Leibniz's employment of this term in his title might illuminate our understanding of the book as a whole.

Kristin Irwin's "Which Reason? Bayle on the Intractability of Evil" is the only contribution that focusses attention on Leibniz's official opposition throughout most of the Theodicy, namely Pierre Bayle. Irwin considers the way in which Leibniz's "Preliminary Dissertation" pitches his account of the relationship between faith and reason against that of Bayle and argues that Leibniz "fails to address Bayle's actual position on the use of reason in attempting to make sense of evil" (p. 43). The problem as Irwin sees it is that Leibniz introduces his key distinction between things that are "above reason" and "against reason" without paying due attention to Bayle's view that the incompatibility between the existence of God and the existence of evil is intelligible to, and establishable by, reason. In doing this, Irwin's paper provides a helpful discussion of Bayle and the way in which his view intersects with that of Isaac Jacquelot, whose approach shares common features with Leibniz's.

In "Is Leibniz's Theodicy a Variation on a Theme by Malebranche?" Nicholas Jolley revisits the relation between the theodicies of Leibniz and Malebranche. His central claim is that the position he took in the introduction to his edition of Malebranche's Dialogues on Metaphysics and on Religion (Cambridge University Press, 1997), that "Leibniz's theodicy was a minor variation on a theme by Malebranche" was in fact "wide of the mark" (p. 56). Jolley argues that, despite the fact that each of the two philosophers represents the other as a kindred spirit on the issue, a crucial gulf opens up between them in connection with the place that is accorded to original sin in their explanation of God's creation of a world with human suffering. He argues that, whereas for Malebranche original sin plays a central role in his legitimation of God's activity, for Leibniz it plays no such role, and is in fact a doctrine that causes him some discomfort. This difference manifests itself further in Jolley's discussion of how Leibniz and Malebranche accommodate the suffering of apparently innocent creatures, a category which for both philosophers includes animals, but which for Leibniz also includes at least some human beings.

"Justice and Circumstances: Theodicy as Universal Religion" is by Donald Rutherford, a scholar who has done as much as anyone to try to emphasize the centrality of Leibniz's theodicy and the concept of divine justice that it embodies for our understanding of Leibniz's other philosophical ideas.[1] Echoing one of Mercer's themes, Rutherford argues that, whilst Leibniz goes to some lengths to ensure that his Theodicy is perfectly consistent with 17th Century Christianity, it is essentially the work of one who believes in a universal natural religion. Rutherford's focus is on Leibniz's conception of grace and the way in which it is independent of the recipient's allegiance to any particular religion. Leibniz claims that belief in a just God who has created the best of all possible worlds in which our own happiness is assured is a necessary condition for the attainment of blessedness but, Rutherford points out, Leibniz claims that this cannot be known with certainty. He argues that, on Leibniz's account, this epistemic gap may only be closed by a faith that is dependent on God's grace, where the notion of grace is tied to the role that the circumstances in which a given individual finds herself at particular points in her existence plays in her belief formation. On Rutherford's view, the reception of grace is unforeseeable and dependent on "moral luck", rather than intrinsic merit or membership in a given religious tradition. And, as such, it is a universally available "religious moment at the heart of Leibniz's thought" (p. 90).

"The Theoretical Foundations of the Leibnizian Theodicy and its Apologetic Aim," is by Paul Rateau, author of a recent and influential book, La question du mal chez Leibniz: fondements et élaboration de la Théodicée, (Paris: Honoré Champion, 2008). Rateau aims to show that, although "theodicy" has now come to refer generically to any attempt to make sense of God's creation of a world in which there is evil, we need to recognize that the Theodicy is a distinctive kind of enquiry. According to Rateau, the structure of the work, and of Leibniz's project, is revealed once we take seriously Leibniz's characterization of his views as "a quasi kind of science" because it has both "refutative and defensive parts" and because it "does not contain any demonstration of necessity (as a true science demands)" (p. 109). He invites us to consider the structure of Leibniz's book in light of the related distinction that Rateau draws between "two wings" of Leibniz's approach. One of these offers a defence of God's justice; the other is doctrinal. And the two are differentiated by the kinds of reasoning that Leibniz employs, with the former reliant on a posteriori, and hence merely probable, considerations, and the latter on a priori demonstrative proofs (albeit proofs whose conclusions are not themselves necessary truths). Rateau ends by demonstrating this approach in action in connection with the notion of moral necessity and the concerns about the spectre of necessitarianism in Leibniz's account of divine freedom.

In "Metaphysical Evil Revisited", Maria Rosa Antognazza considers and rejects a common reading of Leibniz's conception of metaphysical evil that entails that all creatures are evil simply in virtue of the imperfection associated with their finitude. She argues that Leibniz's notion is best understood when set against the backdrop of a number of accounts of evil that would have been well-known in Leibniz's day -- in particular, those of Augustine, Aquinas, Suárez, and William King. With these in view, she discusses the ways in which Leibniz accepts and rejects elements of the then dominant Augustinian tradition, and argues that Leibniz intends the concept of metaphysical evil to capture what the scholastics would have called "natural evils", namely, those that are independent of moral considerations.

Tad M. Schmaltz tackles the issue of "Moral Evil and Divine Concurrence in the Theodicy". He is concerned to dispel the thought that Leibniz presented the problem of God's moral concurrence in sin as the most difficult component in the problem of evil (see Theodicy sec. 107) only in order to make his solution appear more appealing. According to Schmaltz, God's moral concurrence represents a very real problem for Leibniz. Indeed, he suggests Leibniz had more reason to be concerned with this threat to divine justice than others, such as the fact that God created a world containing natural disasters. With this in mind, Schmaltz examines Leibniz's attempts to deal with the problem of moral concurrence in terms of divine permission of moral evil and the difficulties that arise for his approach. Schmaltz defends Leibniz against some of the more common charges that have been raised by commentators., The most novel part of the discussion comes at the end when he brings out the importance of another of Leibniz's concepts, that of a "deficient cause", which is Augustinian in origin. This notion seems to have gone without attention from previous scholars, but once articulated it enables Schmaltz to argue for the thesis that it "serves to support [Leibniz's] claim that God merely permits sinful action without morally concurring in it" (p. 136).

Michael J. Murray returns to a theme with which he has been concerned before in "Vindicatio Dei: Evil as a Result of God's Free Choice of the Best," namely, the role that the notion of moral necessity plays in Leibniz's account of God's freedom.[2] Murray's main aim is to revitalise the significance of this strand in Leibniz's thinking by placing it in its proper historical context, the early seventeenth century Jesuit tradition. In particular, he provides a detailed discussion of a debate over competing conceptions of moral necessity between Diego Granado and Diego Ruiz de Montoya, and of the subsequent attack on the notion, mounted primarily by Jorge Hemelman and Pedro Hurtado de Mendoza. Murray closes with a brief discussion of six theses endorsed by the moral necessitarians, providing texts from Leibniz to support the claim that "Leibniz endorsed a variant" of the position advocated by Granado and Ruiz, and that he "seems to have taken this view to be a crucial component in his attempt to blunt the force of necessitarianism" (p. 171). In doing so, he self-consciously sets the stage for an assessment of how successful this strand in Leibniz's theodicy is, something that awaits a "yet to be fully made" assessment of the viability of the notion of moral necessity itself (p. 171).

Augustín Echavarría ("Leibniz's Dilemma on Predestination") is concerned with the ways in which Leibniz negotiates the controversies, regarding the scope of salvation and the nature and grounds of election, that were prominent among his contemporaries. Echavarría emphasizes the significant constraints that are placed on Leibniz by his commitment to the claim that all substances have complete concepts that were present in the divine mind at creation and grounded a single creative act whose content was wholly determinate and fully accessible to God. With this constraint in mind, he discusses the ways in which Leibniz appeals to the traditional distinction between the antecedent and consequent will of God in order to make room for the truth of the claim that God desired universal salvation despite the fact that this was not a feature of the world he created. According to Echavarría, Leibniz's invocation of the notion of "sufficient grace" allows him to provide a consistent answer to these charges. However, Echavarría argues that it is one that flies in the face of the libertarian conception of free will that was embraced by those whose views Leibniz was appropriating and of the significance of the role of freedom that they accorded in their justification of God's ways.

In "Justice, Happiness, and Perfection in Leibniz's City of God," Robert Merrihew Adams' main claim is that a proper understanding of Leibniz's theodicy requires close attention to the role that the concept of the City of God plays in Leibniz's claim that this is the best of all possible worlds. In contrast to accounts that tend to stress the quasi-mathematical conception of the world's perfection in terms of unity in multiplicity, Adams concentrates on the importance of the fact that the best world includes an optimal rational society of intelligent beings, of which God is the monarch. As he notes, this focus serves to make the problem of evil more pressing, in particular when one considers Leibniz's apparent commitment to the eternal damnation of at least some rational beings. Adams does not suggest that Leibniz rejected eternal damnation. However, he finishes with a somewhat radical thesis: that belief in eternal damnation (which is rationally admissible, but unproven by Leibniz's lights) may have been presented as true by Leibniz because he thought of it as the "safest" means by which to ensure the maximal happiness of rational beings. Thus Adams opens up interesting possibilities for further examination of the role of pragmatic concerns in the justification of the theoretical claims that we find in Leibniz's philosophical theology and, indeed, his philosophy more generally.

For those familiar Daniel Garber's recent work, it will perhaps come as no surprise that his essay bears the title "Monads and the Theodicy: Reading Leibniz." Garber is interested in the fact that Leibniz's monadological metaphysics (roughly, the claim that all facts supervene on facts about immaterial mind-like substances and their intrinsic properties) barely makes its presence felt in the Theodicy, despite the fact that it was composed at a time when Leibniz appears to have been committed to the doctrine (Garber is famous for having denied that this is the case earlier in Leibniz's career).[3] Garber sets himself the task of explaining why. One view that has been advanced is that Leibniz is trying to hide some of his more controversial thoughts in order not to put off potential converts to his solution of the problem of evil. However, Garber argues that monads are not to be found for the more simple reason that they are largely irrelevant for Leibniz's exposition of the matters at hand. He suggests that the "modularity" of Leibniz's system is such that he can coherently discuss theodicy without having to wade into the more treacherous waters of his account of the fundamental nature of reality, the full details of which, Garber maintains, eluded Leibniz himself to the end of his life.

The volume ends with 'Leibniz's Theodicy as a Critique of Spinoza and Bayle -- and Blueprint for the Philosophy Wars of the 18th Century," by Jonathan Israel. Israel argues for the thesis that the contrast between Leibniz on the one hand and Bayle and Spinoza on the other should provide a richer resource for understanding the emergence of enlightenment secularization than the common focus on Hume and Kant. He suggests that the Theodicy evidences Leibniz's clear-sighted understanding of the threat to the traditional conception of values both from Spinoza's naturalism and the irrationalism of Bayle. Furthermore, he argues that it is only against this background, and its later reception in the writings of Voltaire and Rousseau, that we can hope to gain a proper understanding of the way in which the most fundamental Enlightenment controversies evolved.

Whilst there is inevitably some variability in quality, the essays all make interesting contributions to the literature, and there is something to learn from each of them. Many of them are very good, and the best are excellent and likely to making lasting contributions to the topics that they cover. The volume deserves the attention of anyone concerned with the problem of evil in the early modern period, and will doubtless become a standard reference for those who have an interest in the Theodicy or Leibniz's philosophy of religion. Indeed, absent an English-language monograph on the Theodicy, this book probably stands as the best overall introduction to the work in English, albeit at a quite advanced level.

[1] See his Leibniz and the Rational Order of Nature (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1995).

[2] See his "Pre-Leibnizian Moral Necessity," The Leibniz Review 2004, pp.1-28.

[3] This thesis has been advanced in several publications, but it was introduced in "Leibniz and the Foundations of Physics: The Middle Years," in K. Okruhlik and J. R. Brown (eds.), The Natural Philosophy of Leibniz (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1985), pp. 27-130.