New Perspectives on Type-Identity: The Mental and the Physical

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Simone Gozzano and Christopher S. Hill (eds.), New Perspectives on Type-Identity: The Mental and the Physical, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 304pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107000148.

Reviewed by Janet Levin, University of Southern California


This anthology comprises a well-chosen collection of papers that do, as advertised, provide 'new perspectives' -- both philosophical and neuroscientific -- on the psycho-physical type-identity thesis originally proposed in the 1950's and 60's by Place, Feigl, and Smart: that types of sensations and perceptual experiences (such as pain and the experience of green) can be reduced to, or identified with, certain types of neural states. As Gozzano and Hill point out in their helpful introduction (p. 1), this thesis went quickly from being regarded as a promising response to dualism and behaviorism -- one that places psycho-physical identity statements such as 'pain = C-fiber stimulation'[1] squarely among such scientifically respectable a posteriori generalizations as 'heat = mean kinetic energy' -- to being 'summarily dismissed'.

A primary reason for this dismissal, they remind us, was the charge that the thesis conflicts with the intuitively attractive claim, first advanced by Putnam and Fodor, that creatures with internal states that occupy the same causal-functional roles in their cognitive systems are in the same mental states -- even if the state-types that occupy those roles are physically disparate. Putnam, Fodor, and others thus sought to identify mental states with those second-order causal-functional properties, and proposed that neural state-types such as C-fiber stimulation are merely one among multiple realizations of those higher-level states. On this view, humans, octopi, Martians, and androids could literally be in the same mental states -- and the interactions among these states and their effects on behavior could be explained by a higher-level, autonomous, psychological theory.

However, as Gozzano and Hill report, there are now significant worries about theories that take neural state-types merely to realize mental state-types, and one of their aims in this volume is to reevaluate the prospects for the identity thesis by bringing together some of these criticisms, and some new and promising responses to the initial Putnam-Fodor objections. They also include some interesting responses to recent arguments against the type-identity thesis by property dualists, and some recent proposals for developing a type-identity thesis that is compatible with both our philosophical intuitions and the empirical facts.

Four chapters in this volume -- by William Bechtel (Chapter 2), John Bickle (Chapter 4), Robert McCauley (Chapter 9), and Lawrence Shapiro and Thomas Polger(Chapter 13) -- provide detailed, empirically informed, challenges to the claim that mental states are multiply realized by physically disparate types. Each argues, invoking different cases, that attention to the practices of neuroscience and cognitive psychology suggests that the plausibility of the arguments for multiple realization rely on a mismatch between the fineness of grain used to individuate psychological states and their purported neural realizers.

As Bechtel argues, cognitive psychology takes there to be less functional similarity among diverse organisms such as humans and octopi than suggested by early theorists such as Putnam and Fodor. He also argues, conversely, that neuroscience often treats somewhat dissimilar physical 'realizations' as instances of the same neural state if they share certain more general physical properties common to all organisms that instantiate the relevant psychological generalizations. He focuses on the study of circadian rhythms in different organisms, and suggests that, although the 'circadian clocks' of different species have significant physical dissimilarities, they are considered by neuroscientists to belong to the same physical type as long as they share properties that are conserved in their evolutionary descent from a common ancestor.

John Bickle and Robert McCauley, in Chapters 4 and 9, also argue that the study of recent work in the neurosciences is essential for a fair appraisal of the identity thesis (though both make a number of comments along the way about the bankruptcy of traditional philosophical methods that are at best misleading).[2] Bickle focuses on studies of memory consolidation in a number of species, and maintains (p. 105) that they reveal certain more abstract physical similarities in the molecular processes that underlie memory consolidation among organisms as 'diverse as fruit flies, sea slugs and mammals', while McCauley focuses on recent work on the mechanism of face recognition that finds it to occur, in a variety of species, in the fusiform gyrus -- albeit in somewhat physically different ways.

All these theorists argue, convincingly, that empirical scientists think there is more flexibility in the individuation of psychological and neural states than is assumed by the early critics of the type-identity thesis. If there are indeed abstract physical (and not merely psychofunctional) similarities among physically different types of organisms with the same circadian clocks, memory consolidation mechanisms, or face recognition capacities, then what looked like multiple realization may instead be (a coarser sort of) psycho-physical type identity -- and the identity thesis can meet many of Putnam's and Fodor's early objections. It may be hard, however, for those not at home in the neuroscience lab to appraise this question, and it is therefore helpful that Shapiro and Polger, in Chapter 13 (p. 279), propose five conditions that lower-level kinds with physical differences must meet even to be candidates for the multiple realization of a higher-level kind -- and also (p. 283) a four-part criterion for when such candidates are 'different in ways relevant to their sameness', and thereby pass the test. They (tentatively) suggest that these conditions can be met by a number of interesting psychological phenomena -- and that therefore, in many cases, the type-identity thesis can be affirmed.

Another question addressed in this volume is whether non-reductive physicalism faces problems of its own, in particular, the 'causal exclusion problem' introduced byJaegwon Kim. Kim argues that if pain is an irreducibly mental event that causes wincing, then -- given that physicalism requires all physical events to have a complete physical cause -- pain and its neural realization must either overdetermine, or jointly cause, the wincing. But since both these alternatives are implausible, Kim argues, the mental event must be causally inefficacious. In Chapter 11, Alyssa Ney discusses some recent attempts to respond to Kim's challenge by arguing that the implausibility of regarding behavior as produced by both mental and physical causes depends on an 'idiosyncratic' notion of causation as generation or production, rather than regularity or counterfactual dependence. Ney argues, in response, that Kim's notion is not idiosyncratic, but occurs in many explanations in physics -- and, in addition, is at least implicitly invoked by philosophers in their discussions of human agency.

Frank Jackson (Chapter 7), in a wider-ranging discussion of the relation between functionalism and the type-identity theory, also touches on the question of mental causation. Jackson agrees that behavior is uniquely produced by neural events, and he explains (p. 153) the intuition that it is produced by a distinct mental cause by proposing that an individual's 'system has coded into it' that the neural event plays a certain role -- say, the pain role -- and thus that the individual represents N as occupying that role, and thus as pain (since on Jackson's view, the claim that pain occupies that role is known a priori). Both essays, in short, uphold Kim's contention that only the type-identity of mental and physical events can account for mental causation, though I suspect that non-reductive physicalists would have something more to say.

Interestingly, Kim's own contribution to this volume (Chapter 8) does not concern mental causation, but instead argues that a mere token identity thesis does not qualify as a physicalistic account of mental states. He contends that any robust version of physicalism must understand instances of mental states such as pain to be tokens either of a common physical type, as proposed by the identity thesis, or, alternatively, one of a number of physical types that realize the same causal-functional role. Kim (tentatively) expresses doubt that the type-identity thesis provides the most plausible physicalist account of experiences -- and indeed takes seriously some recent neo-Cartesian arguments by property dualists (such as Chalmers) against any form of physicalism at all. He concludes (p. 183) with the contention that 'the problem of qualia may well be the one remaining issue in the current debate about the mind-body problem. If this problem finds a physicalist solution, physicalism [of one sort or another] would finally be home free'.

It is thus good news that this volume includes three chapters that explicitly address these neo-Cartesian arguments that contend that since (i) we can clearly conceive of a world -- call it a 'zombie world' -- in which there are physical duplicates of ourselves who have no conscious experiences, and since (ii) the (clear) conceivability of a world entails its possibility, it follows that such a world is possible. And thus, if psycho-physical identity statements are (as many believe) necessary truths, if true at all, then psycho-physical identity theses cannot be true. Some identity theorists, e.g. Jackson, respond to this argument by contending that sensation terms are a priori equivalent to causal-functional descriptions -- and that therefore one cannot conceive of a world in which our physical duplicates, who presumably share our causal-functional organization, do not share our experiences as well. This response, however, is controversial, and indeed the essays in this volume offer different solutions.

In Chapter 12, John Perry argues that the only way that a zombie world can be conceivable is for conscious experiences, in that world, to be either epiphenomenal, or, if they do have causal powers, to overdetermine, or preempt what would otherwise be the physical causes of, their effects. But, Perry argues, very few people believe this to be true in our world. Thus, if these consequences were clearly articulated, there would be only a small subset of thinkers who would continue to find it conceivable that there be a world physically indiscernible from ours in which there are no conscious experiences. Moreover, he argues, any attempts to weaken the conditions on physical indiscernibility, or to characterize worlds physically indiscernible from ours but with different laws, run into problems of their own. Perry's chapter makes the causal commitments of a zombie world explicit. However, many dualists are willing, given the alternatives, to accept the epiphenomenality of qualitative states or properties, and -- as we've seen -- even some (non-reductive) physicalists are willing to accept the overdetermination of certain physical events by their physical and mental causes. Thus, although Perry has narrowed down the class of those who could find a zombie world compatible with their views about the mental causation of behavior, there remains a significant group who would find such a world coherently conceivable.

Simone Gozzano, in Chapter 4, examines a version of the first premise of this neo-Cartesian argument that is favored by Kripke, namely, that it is conceivable that a creature could be in pain, but have no C-fiber stimulation. Gozzano argues (p. 124) that it is unclear how we can conceive that distinct individuals (or one individual at different times) are in pain without implicitly affirming physicalism.  If a state is a particular type of sensation if and only if it feels a certain way to a subject -- that is, if sensations are 'intrinsically subjective' -- then the only way we can imagine distinct individuals who are both in pain is to consult some objective criterion for when they are feeling that way, since this cannot be determined from some common subjective point of view. And the most plausible candidate for this objective condition, he argues, is that they are in the same type of physical state. This, like Perry's argument, shows that it may be harder to describe a coherently conceivable zombie world (or its converse) than one may think, and Gozzano raises an interesting question about how to determine the occurrence of the same type of 'intrinsically subjective' state in different individuals. But it seems that the premise in question is better rendered as an invitation to imagine that some particular individual -- perhaps we ourselves right now in pain -- could be feeling like that without the occurrence of any C-fiber stimulation. And according to Kripke, evaluating such modal claims does not require having criteria for identifying an individual with those properties in another possible world. But if so, and if conceivability entails possibility, the identity thesis is not necessary, and is thus not true.

 Balog, however,  challenges this entailment in Chapter 1, arguing not that zombie worlds are inconceivable, but that their conceivability does not entail their possibility. She advances a version of the Phenomenal Concepts Strategy, the view that the irreducibility of phenomenal to physical concepts does not entail the non-identity of phenomenal and physical properties. On Balog's 'quotational' account, any phenomenal concept acquired in introspection is a special sort of demonstrative concept that is partially constituted by a token of the very phenomenal type it denotes. This view, Balog argues, explains why phenomenal concepts of neural states cannot be equivalent to physical-functional concepts of those states -- and therefore why the existence of zombies will always be conceivable, even if phenomenal states are identical with certain types of neural states.

This is a promising response to the zombie argument (though it's not clear that one needs to understand phenomenal concepts as including tokens of their referents to explain why their irreducibility to physical concepts does not entail the non-identity of phenomenal and physical states). Nonetheless, it seems as though some version of the phenomenal concept strategy may provide the best chance of responding to these arguments, and if so, then we can see how statements such as 'pain = C-fiber stimulation' could be true even if there are no topic-neutral equivalents of our phenomenal terms or concepts.

In a general discussion of the relation between the reductive explainability of one set of properties in terms of another and the identity of those properties, AnsgarBeckermann (Chapter 3) makes the related point that -- contrary to theorists such as C.D. Broad, Joseph Levine, and Frank Jackson -- the semantics of the natural kind terms used in making identity statements such as 'water = H2O' suggests that there need be no reductive explanation of the former set of properties by the latter for their identity to be justifiably affirmed. (Brian McLaughlin makes a similar point in Chapter 10.) On the other hand, Beckermann argues, in macro-micro property identity statements such as 'Heat = mke', even the reductive explainability of the macro-properties in terms of the micro-properties would not support the claim that those properties are type-identical (rather than that the former realizes the latter) -- and he argues that identity statements such as 'pain = C-fiber stimulation' are closer to the latter sort of property identities. So even the reductive explainability of pain in terms of C-fiber stimulation would not suffice to establish the type-identity thesis.

And thus, it seems, the fate of the identity thesis will turn, as is originators believed, on whether it provides a better explanation than dualism (or multiple realization) of phenomena such as mental causation, already discussed, and the (presumed) correlation between subjects' reports of having a certain type of experience and the occurrence of some type of neural activity in their brains. There are some, however (e.g., Jaegwon Kim), who contend that identity statements can never provide bona-fide explanations, since all they can do is enable us to describe a single phenomenon in a different way. In Chapter 10 (pp. 226-7), Brian McLaughlin considers Kim's contention and responds, in my view plausibly, that it is just this sort of epistemic role that we should expect explanations to play. He concludes that if the relevant psychological-neural correlations exist, then the type-identity thesis could be justified on the grounds that it provides the best explanation of them.

On the other hand, Christopher Hill (in Chapter 6) argues that psychological-neural correlations may not be the ones that matter. His view is that perceptual experiences and bodily sensations are best construed as (perceptual or quasi-perceptual) representations of, respectively, properties in the world or 'extra-cranial regions of the body'. But a representational theory of pain must hold that pain states with the same qualitative character track or co-vary with the same 'extra-cranial' properties, and thus one should expect to find correlations there. Hill provides (pp. 131-142) a number of ingenious suggestions as to what the correlated extra-cranial properties could be, although he acknowledges (p. 142) that 'it is an open question whether the strategies can be fully successful'. And thus, given that he acknowledges (p. 131) that 'pain is strongly correlated with activity in various regions of the brain', one may wonder why he does not just embrace a psychological-neural type-identity thesis.

One problem, Hill contends (p. 143), is that doing so would force us to treat awareness of one's own qualitative states (not as quasi-perceptual, but) as requiring the application of phenomenal concepts to one's own neural states, and this would entail that those with 'limited powers of conception' such as animals and babies are not aware of their perceptual experiences and pains. It seems, however, that there may be two senses of awareness in play: if we understand being aware of state S as merely a matter of experiencing state S, then babies and animals can be aware of their mental (that is, neural) states without having to conceptualize them in any way; and if we understand being aware of state S as instead a matter of knowing what it's like to be in S, then although this sort of awareness would indeed require conceptualization, it's not obvious that babies and animals have this capacity. However, Hill also gives a number of other reasons -- some conceptual, some empirical -- for endorsingrepresentationalist accounts of bodily sensations, and the jury is still out.

In any case, Hill's essay raises new and interesting questions about the physical bases of qualitative states and, like many others in this volume, provides perspectives on the type-identity thesis that are both philosophically acute and informed by recent findings in the neurosciences. In addition, many of the contributions provide insightful historical accounts of the fortunes of the type-identity thesis -- and indeed, more generally, of physicalistic accounts of the mind. Thus the essays in this anthology are not merely individually interesting, and well worth reading on their own, but the volume as a whole hangs together in a way that is unusually instructive, and would be an excellent and provocative choice for a graduate seminar in the philosophy of mind.

[1] In keeping with tradition, I use 'pain = C-fiber stimulation' as an example of a psycho-physical identity statement.  I recognize that no one believes that it’s likely to be true.

[2] For example, Bickle dismisses the attempts to give 'translational reductions' of mental state vocabulary without explaining why 'topic neutral' characterizations were thought to be needed to avoid property dualism, and McCauley (p. 188) suggests that 'the pronouncements of contemporary philosophers of mind about what it must be like to have mental lives like ours or about unbridgeable gaps in scientific accounts of consciousness risk comparisons with Hegel’s attempt to prove that there were only seven planets'.  (See Craig, E. and Hoskin, M.  Journal of the History of Astronomy xxiii, 1992, for an account of what Hegel was really trying to do, namely, to provide a hypothesis that explains the perceived distance between Jupiter and Mars without having to postulate an extra hidden planet.)