New Waves in Political Philosophy

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Boudewijn de Bruin and Christopher F. Zurn (eds.), New Waves in Political Philosophy, Palgrave Macmillan, 2009, 226pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780230221239.

Reviewed by Ella Myers, University of Utah



Reviewing an edited volume is arguably more challenging than reviewing the work of a single author. That task becomes all the more daunting when the volume in question lacks any organizing theme. In the case of New Waves in Political Philosophy, there are no central questions, concepts, thinkers, or texts linking the contributions to one another. The editors, to their credit, announce this fact in the introduction, explaining that the text offers a “snapshot” of contemporary political philosophy and is intended to reflect the “heterogeneity” of recent research. According to De Bruin and Zurn, the collection of 11 essays demonstrates the “vibrancy” of the field by treating a vast array of topics, some “perennial”, some resurgent, and others “more recently put on the agenda”. (Some of the categorizations here are truly bizarre. “Citizenship” is a new issue in political philosophy? Tell that to Aristotle.)

The breadth of the work included in the volume ensures that any attempt to create a thread connecting the pieces to one another is bound to feel forced. The most fruitful approach to take to a book of this kind is to treat each contribution individually. Due to space constraints, however, I will simply list eight of the pieces, to give potential readers some hint of the offerings, before reflecting on three particularly interesting and thought-provoking contributions.

The essays not discussed in this review include: “Liberty and its Circumstances: A Functional Approach” by Lena Halldenius; “Human Needs and Political Judgment” by Leonard Hamilton; “Making Nonsense of Loyalty to Country” by Simon Keller; “Reflexive Democracy as Popular Sovereignty” by Kevin Olson; “Democratic Legitimacy without Collective Rationality” by Fabienne Peter; “The Political Philosophy of Social Suffering” by Emmanuel Renault; “The Subject of Multiculturalism: Culture, Religion, Language, Ethnicity, Nationality and Race?” by Sarah Song; and “The Aesthetic of Freedom” by Ajume Wingo. Interested readers should consult the editors’ introduction for helpful short summaries of the essays.

Amy Allen’s “Feminism and the Subject of Politics” addresses the relevance of “the subject” to feminist political thought. The Foucaultian notion of subjection has been influential in recent decades among feminists who draw on it to theorize the gendered subject. Yet Linda Zerilli, drawing on the work of Arendt, has criticized this preoccupation with the category of “the subject”, suggesting that it amounts to an evasion of genuinely political “world-building” practices. Against this background, Allen attempts to articulate a third alternative, guided by the conviction that while “understanding subjection is a crucial task for feminist theory”, it “is not enough” (3). Any inquiry into subjection, “an intrasubjective mechanism”, must be coupled with attention to more collective and intersubjective forms of relation. What is required, according to Allen, is a single theoretical framework that focuses simultaneously on “the intrasubjective and intersubjective” dimensions of politics. Although Allen offers only a sketch of what this approach might look like, the sketch is a compelling one, and its significance extends well beyond the domain of feminist political theory.

Allen’s integrative position draws on Foucault’s and Arendt’s distinctive conceptions of politics, which she presents as important correctives to one another. “The politics of ourselves”, which Allen draws out of Foucault’s thought, is meant to capture the interplay between technologies of domination that are constitutive of the subject and technologies of the self that allow the subject to act on itself. This notion of politics is rooted in the ambivalence of subjection or assujettisement itself, in which constraint (power-over) and enablement (power-to) are fully intertwined. From a feminist perspective, “the politics of ourselves” captures the entanglement of subordination and empowerment, helping us to see the gendered subject as both “the site of inscription of power relations” and as “the locus of potential transformation of such power relations” (8). Yet as the term suggests, “the politics of ourselves” centers on an intrasubjective dynamic. Foucault says little about collective or intersubjective practices of transformation, a silence that Allen hopes to remedy by turning to Arendt’s conception of politics as collective action, rooted in a conception of power as “power-with”.

The strength of Allen’s argument lies in her attempt to articulate the connection between these two dimensions of politics. She persuasively argues that understanding “progressive self-transformation” requires thinking about “the collective social and political movements that generate the vocabularies of contestation, the normative frameworks, and the conceptual resources that enable such individual actions”. On the other hand, movements are made up of individuals “whose identities have been structured by … relations of subordination” such that intrasubjective “work on the self” has a role to play in ensuring that potentially transformative collective efforts do not simply “reinscribe subordination” (12). Allen directs us to examine the ways in which intra- and inter- subjective relations reciprocally influence one another.

As Allen admits, her proposal for an integrative approach is, at this stage, suggestive rather than fully formulated. There are at least two ways in which the position she introduces might be elaborated. First, the exchange between Foucault and Arendt could be deepened. In this essay, Foucault represents one portrait of politics, and Arendt another. It would be interesting to consider strands of Foucault’s thinking that seem to be open to a collective conception of politics, and also to engage with features of Arendt’s work that bear on the question of the self’s relationship to itself. For example, Foucault’s often overlooked idea of a “counter-power” born of human multiplicity, and which discipline attempts to prevent and contain, bears affinities with an Arendtian understanding of power as power-with. Similarly, Arendt does not ignore intra-subjective relations, nor does she simply juxtapose them with what is properly political. Indeed, she suggests that engaging with plurality within the self — the “two-in-one” - may serve to initiate us into worldly plurality, the very condition of politics.

The second path for developing Allen’s insights would involve identifying cases in which the intra and inter- subjective dimensions of politics are already “integrated” in practice. William Connolly has offered some examples of the interplay between “tactics of the self” and “macro-politics”, but they remain rather hypothetical. An exciting extension of both Allen’s and Connolly’s work would examine concrete instances in which the “politics of ourselves” shapes, and is shaped by, collective organizing efforts.

In “Rethinking Ideology”, Rahel Jaeggi makes a persuasive case for the “revitalization” of ideology critique. Acknowledging that even during the height of Marxist theory, the meaning of ideology critique — and even of ideology itself — was “anything but clear,” Jaeggi aims to illuminate the character of ideology critique through a consideration of two relevant paradoxes. The first, posited by Adorno, is that “truth and untruth are always entwined” in ideology. The second is the observation that the critique of ideology claims to be a “non-moralizing or non-normative critique that is nevertheless normatively significant”. According to Jaeggi, these statements are far from incidental: “the point and the productivity of the critique of ideology are hidden in exactly this seemingly paradoxical structure” (66).

Jaeggi’s choice to approach her subject matter by examining these apparent paradoxes is creative and interesting, though her treatment of the first seems more successful than the second. Jaeggi explains that it is the case that ideologies are “simultaneously true and false” insofar as “they correspond at once adequately and inadequately to ‘reality’”. Most helpfully, she offers: “Since they are socially induced, they are not merely an error or a cognitive mistake; in a certain sense, they are mistakes with better reasons, because they are grounded in the properties and conditions of reality” (68). While Jaeggi’s exposition of the truth/untruth paradox is convincing, her turn to the problem of normativity poses some difficulties.

Ideology critique, Jaeggi explains, is double-edged: it reveals an epistemic problem — that we misunderstand something — and a normative problem — the “wrongness of the situation”. The second paradox concerns this question of wrongness. Jaeggi asks, is it possible for the critique of ideology to be “non-normative” yet “normatively significant”? Her answer rests on a distinction between “external” and “internal” standards of evaluation and the claim that ideology critique, as “immanent critique”, defies this opposition.

Recognizing that the critique of ideology must do more than denaturalize existing conditions and promote a “transformational transcending of the status quo”, Jaeggi argues that ideology critique is indeed “normatively significant” but not “normativistic”. By this, she means that ideology critique does not rely on “external normative standards that are introduced against which reality is measured” (73). This clarification is not entirely satisfying, however, for two reasons. First, the “external” normative standard she references is something of a straw man. What kind of standard is truly “external” to the context in which it is deployed? What theories does Jaeggi have in mind when she references norms that are “outside” of the practices being scrutinized? The second problem lies in Jaeggi’s attempt to specify that while ideology critique is “immanent”, it is not merely “internal”. That is, she claims that ideology critique is distinct from the kind of critique (which she associates with Michael Walzer) that draws on “ideals and norms” that are “part of a particular community but are not de facto realized in that community” (74). While Jaeggi may be right that the disadvantages of this view are obvious, her alternative conception, according to which ideology critique “relies on not just actual but also justified norms”, is rather perplexing. Having denied that “external” standards have a place in ideology critique, she now introduces the idea of “justified” norms as a way of avoiding the problems of a fully “internal” mode of critique. Yet she does not theorize what this justification consists in, or show that it does not amount to smuggling back in some notion of “external” criteria. Her final suggestion, that the normativity of ideology critique consists in a “process” it sets into motion, is intriguing but awaits careful defense. More robust theoretical support is needed for the claim that immanent critique is “simultaneously a critique of reality that is deficient according to certain norms and a critique of those norms themselves” (76).

Jaeggi presents a thoughtful and frequently incisive case for ideology critique as a valuable response to domination. Her contention that such critique “opposes attempts to determine the standards of critique ‘externally,’ … yet on the other hand, is not wholly dependent on the ethical and moral resources of a given community” is certainly appealing, though not fully supported here. A longer text might allow Jaeggi to mount her arguments with greater specificity, and even more effectively persuade her readers of ideology critique’s power and purpose.

Mika LaVaque-Manty’s “Finding Theoretical Concepts in the Real World: The Case of the Precariat” offers a smart and well-argued reading of a new political entity, the precariat, that has recently emerged in Europe (and was especially significant in the 2006 protests in France opposing government-backed labor reforms). This essay is notable for doing very well what many political philosophers only aspire to: engaging with existing political practice — “the real world” — in a nuanced, theoretically sophisticated way. The results are impressive and ought to serve as an invitation to others to attempt the difficult, but potentially very rewarding, work of interpreting the present.

The “precariat”, as LaVaque-Manty explains, is a term meant to capture a new collective actor — those who face an increasingly precarious working life. Significantly, the precariat is a “condition concept”, meant to refer to a common condition faced by its members. For this reason, the precariat “cuts across other familiar sociological categories: race, gender, nationality, even socio-economic class” (107). LaVaque-Manty’s analysis addresses some of the complexities of the concept, particularly as a tool of mobilization, asking why it is that certain groups (middle-aged blue collar workers) have been largely excluded from the category and reflecting on the costs of a strictly economic (rather than racial or cultural) conception of vulnerability. The most interesting and well-developed part of the essay, however, takes up the question “Why is there no American precariat?”

LaVaque-Manty notes that “by objective criteria”, there is a precariat in the U.S. if there is one in Europe. Yet "there is nothing understood as the precariat in the United States" (113). To account for this difference, the essay turns to a consideration of how different political cultures “may foster or else impede” the politicization of particular issues (112). Drawing on the notion of path-dependence, LaVaque-Manty proposes that to understand why the precariat has appeared in Europe but not in the U.S. requires tending to the way in which vulnerability has been conceptualized historically in each context. He makes a strong argument that the U.S. has continually depoliticized vulnerability, treating it as a natural fact, relatively independent of intentional human control. Within this framework, individuals who are able to overcome this natural vulnerability are seen as especially admirable. Nevertheless there is almost no way for such a notion of vulnerability to serve as the basis of collective agency. This is in marked contrast with Europe, as LaVaque-Manty argues, where a clearly politicized conception of vulnerability informs the “European Social Model”. In Europe, “vulnerability is something that institutions can do something about” (117).

What is missing in the U.S., then, is not simply the label “precariat”, but a “concept and theory of vulnerability” that would allow such a group to come into being. According to LaVaque-Manty, the “prevailing political discourse” in the U.S. makes the organization or recognition of the precariat identity, as it has been formulated in Europe, unlikely. While this is an insightful observation, the essay doesn’st consider the question of exactly how “path dependent” our political discourses are. That is, while it may be “no surprise” that there is not a precariat in the U.S., how settled or certain is this situation? Might new political events, such as the present economic crisis, give rise to counter-discourses that present vulnerability in a less naturalized way? Alternately, how secure is the politicized conception of vulnerability LaVaque-Manty attributes to pan-European political culture? Has the advance of neoliberalism de-stabilized the understanding of vulnerability that previously guided the activities of the welfare state? LaVaque-Manty’s essay encourages us to continue the provocative and timely conversation it initiates.

While some readers may be frustrated by the sweeping range of this collection, anyone interested in recent political philosophy is likely to find something interesting here. Although the book reads more like a series of monologues than a dialogue, it offers some very interesting perspectives, provided that one is willing to engage with each of the essays on its own terms.