Nicomachean Ethics, Books II-IV

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Aristotle, Nicomachean Ethics, Books II-IV, C. C. W. Taylor (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2006, 258pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780198250678.

Reviewed by Allan Gotthelf, University of Pittsburgh


In this latest addition to OUP's famous and valuable Clarendon Aristotle Series, Christopher Taylor provides, for students and professionals alike, a helpfully close translation of, and much useful commentary on, the second, third, and fourth books of the Nicomachean Ethics.[1] After providing, in my own voice, an account of the setting NE I provides for Books II-IV, an overview of the content of these three books, and some key interpretative questions regarding them, I will turn in my review first to the translation, then to the commentary, then to the introduction and back matter, and finally to an overall assessment.

Subject Matter of, and Some Questions Regarding, NE II-IV

NE Book I has established that the human good, happiness, is fundamentally a life of the fullest exercise of the rational part of the soul in accordance with excellence or virtue,[2]and so can be understood in such a way as to be a successful target for action only if one understands the excellences proper to that part of the soul (chs. 7, 13). Because, in addition to the part or capacity which "has reason and thinks" (1098a4-5), there is in the soul another part or capacity that is subject to reason, namely "the appetitive and in general desiring" part (1102b30), there are for Aristotle two sorts of excellence, "excellence of thought on the one hand and excellence of character on the other" (Book II init., tr. Taylor).

Books II-IV are about the virtues of character. They are united by a concern with understanding this sort of excellence, both in general and in its particular cases (the individual virtues), in such a way that listeners aimed at developing and manifesting a fully virtuous character across the breadth and depth of their lives are best positioned to do so. (The virtue of justice, though a virtue of character, is treated separately, in Book V.)

To understand virtue of character in this way requires understanding first how it develops, what the signs of its presence are, what it is for it to be manifested in action (Book II, chs. 1-4), and then what its precise definition is -- its genus as a state concerned with choice (or decision, prohairesis), and its differentia as a state that is in a mean in relation to us -- and what the particular virtues (and vices) operative in the different spheres of feeling and action in life are, and how, given all of this, and certain facts of human psychology, we can best keep ourselves directed towards the virtuous action in any context (Book II, chs. 5-9). To guide ourselves towards virtue, and to evaluate the moral character of others, we need to understand the significant extent to which virtuous actions, and indeed a virtuous character, are up to us and are decided upon, and we need to understand, in some form, the structure of, or elements that go into, a choice or decision. We need in particular a good understanding of such phenomena as the voluntary, the involuntary, choice (or decision), deliberation, wish, the formation of a conception of the good, and the formation and maintenance of a character (Book III, chs. 1-5). With this under one's belt, what remains is to deepen one's grasp of each of the virtues of character, one by one (Book III.6-IV, again putting Book V on justice aside).

As with any Aristotelian text, there is much one wants to be sure one understands in these three books of the Nicomachean Ethics -- the central concepts deployed there, the many theses and arguments developed there regarding the facts of moral life so conceptualized, and the logical structure of the argument across these books. What, for instance, is the purpose of the discussions of the individual virtues? Is it to establish that the states so identified are in fact virtues (and, if not, where and how is that established)? Or is the purpose of the extended review of the virtues perhaps to provide further support for the thesis argued in II.6, that virtue is a mean of a certain sort? Or do they have some other purpose? And whatever their purpose, how are they structured so as to accomplish that purpose -- and what methodology does that structure reflect? Is Aristotle arguingdialectically, as so many have thought, or is there some other methodology at work? In the course of reviewing the merits of Taylor's volume, we will need to ask to what extent, and how well, Taylor addresses these important matters.


Because of the precision with which Aristotle writes, the English reader's first need is an accurate translation, suitable for close philosophical study; this has always been the aim of the Clarendon translations. Ideally, one wants the reader provided with essentially the same content that the Greek provides the Greek reader -- not more, not less. Let's ask if Taylor's translation accomplishes this, and how in that regard it compares, in some sample passages, with the most frequently used recent English translations, of which I single out four:

Ross: W.D. Ross, revised by J.O. Urmson, and then by J. Barnes, in The Complete Works of Aristotle: The Revised Oxford Translation, vol. 2 (Princeton 1984).

Irwin: T. Irwin, Aristotle: Nicomachean Ethics, 2nd edn. (Hackett 1999).

Crisp: R. Crisp, Aristotle: Nicomachean Ethics (Cambridge 2000).

Rowe: S. Broadie and C. Rowe, Aristotle: Nicomachean Ethics: Translation (with historical introduction) by C. Rowe, Philosophical Introduction and Commentary by S. Broadie (Oxford 2002).[3]

The very first sentence of Book II (1103a14-18) is already instructive:

Dittês dê tês aretês ousês, tês men dianoetikês tês de êthikês, hê men dianoêtikê to pleion ek didaskalias echei kai tên genesin kai tên auxêsin, dioper empeirias deitai kai chronou˙ hê d' êthikê ex ethous periginetai, hothen kai tounoma eschêke mikron parekklinon apo tou ethous. (I. Bywater, OCT, Oxford 1894)

Ross: Excellence, then, being of two kinds, intellectual and moral, intellectual excellence in the main owes both its birth and its growth to teaching (for which reason it requires experience and time), while moral excellence comes about as a result of habit, whence also its name is formed by a slight variation from the word for 'habit'.[4]

Irwin: Virtue, then, is of two sorts, virtue of thought and virtue of character. Virtue of thought arises and grows mostly from teaching; that is why it needs experience and time. Virtue of character [i.e., of êthos] results from habit [ethos]; hence its name 'ethical', slightly varied from ethos.

Crisp: Virtue, then, is of two kinds: that of the intellect and that of character. Intellectual virtue owes its origin and development mainly to teaching, for which reason its attainment requires experience and time; virtue of character (êthos) is a result of habituation (ethos), for which reason it has acquired its name through a small variation on 'ethos'.

Rowe: Excellence being of two sorts, then, the one intellectual and the other of character, the intellectual sort mostly both comes into existence and increases as a result of teaching (which is why it requires experience and time), whereas excellence of character results from habituation -- which is in fact the source of the name it has acquired [êthikê], the word for 'character-trait' [êthos] being a slight variation of that for 'habituation' [ĕthos].

Taylor: Excellence being then twofold, excellence of thought on the one hand and excellence of character on the other, excellence of thought comes into being and develops chiefly through teaching, which is why it requires experience and time, but excellence of character results from habit, whence it has acquired its name (êthikê) by a slight modification of the word ethos (habit).

The first thing to notice is that, although some of these translations are arguably better than others in one way or another, all of them are good translations, very different from the paraphrases of the pre-Ross period. The differences (at least the ones I will attend to) lie in (i) whether the opening genitive absolute in the Greek is translated more literally (and accurately), as a participial clause, as is done by Ross, Rowe, and Taylor, or whether it's turned into a separate sentence of its own, as is done by Irwin and Crisp; (ii) whether "of two kinds" (Ross, Crisp), "of two sorts" (Irwin, Rowe) or "twofold" (Taylor) is to be preferred for dittês; (iii) whether ethos should be rendered "habit" (Ross, Irwin, Taylor) or "habituation" (Crisp, Rowe); (iv) how Aristotle's indication of the formation of the Greek term êthikê is to be rendered; and, returning to the general issue behind (i), (v) how smooth and accurate the overall flow of the entire sentence is.

(i) Irwin's  and Crisp's conversion of the genitive absolute into an independent sentence is not a failing: it makes for an increased readability which is arguably more important for their targeted audiences. But a closer mapping onto the Greek syntax is more accurate, and is best for close readers; Taylor is, then, on the right side here, given the purpose of his volume.

(ii) Likewise, though "of two kinds" and "of two sorts" are both more elegant than the slightly artificial "twofold", "twofold" best captures the simple Greek dittês. "Kind" will suggest to many close readers that the Greek is either genos or eidos, and taking it so would be to misread Aristotle. "Sort" is better, standardly being used when the Greek is something other than the technical genos or eidos, but it may still suggest to many that the two sorts of excellence constitute for Aristotle two subkinds under a broader kind and this too puts words in Aristotle's mouth. It's better to leave the interesting matter of the relationship between excellence of thought and excellence of character on the one hand, and excellence in general on the other, for interpretation, as Taylor's rendering does, and does better than any of his competitors' renderings.

(iii) "Habituation" is very tempting for ethos, since Aristotle is speaking of the process that leads to excellence of character, and habit should be the result of that process. But Aristotle has a distinct term for the process, ethismos (see, e.g., 1098b4, 1152a29), and he may actually hold that habits arise from habituation, and character-traits arise from habits, and be saying the second of these; indeed, one reading of the last part of our sentence (as we'll see momentarily) has Aristotle focused on the transition from a habit (ethos) to a virtue or character-trait (êthos). Taylor, then, would again be on the right side. (Interestingly, Crisp, who translates "habituation", translates "habit" at 1179b21. On the other side, Irwin, in his notes to this passage, uses "habituation." Taylor sticks consistently to "habit," referring to the process as "the acquisition of habits.")

(iv) What is it that is explicitly being said here to receive its name from a slight modification or variation of the term ethos? Is it the term êthos (Crisp), the term êthikê (in the phraseêthikê arête) (Ross, Irwin, Taylor), or both êthos and êthikê (Rowe)? The Greek surely favors Ross, Irwin, and Taylor. Perhaps Crisp and Rowe think that adjectives either aren't "names" or are names only derivatively from nouns. Even if so, we might say that what gets its name from ethos is êthikê aretê.

(v) Finally, smoothness of style overall: this can be a personal matter, but I will submit that, apart from the initially awkward feel of the valuable "twofold" and the enduring awkwardness of the useful "on the one hand . . . on the other hand," Taylor's translation is actually smoother and more readable than any of the other four.

Taylor's translation of the long, opening sentence of Book II, then, earns very high marks.

Examination of other passages produces similar results.[5] Likewise, Taylor's choices of English terms for the names of the individual virtues of character are careful and never less than satisfactory (where a virtue is given a name in II.7 but not in IV, I use the former):





























greatness of soul

greatness of soul

greatness of soul






good temper


even temper


good temper




[noun corresponding to 'friendly']







ready wit





Taylor provides a sensitive discussion of many of his choices on pp. 114-19 (and later in the commentary, in the chapters on the individual virtues).

In sum, then, we appear to have a translation that eminently meets the goals of the Clarendon series: it is accurate, readable, and accompanied by a philosophically-oriented commentary -- to which we now turn.


To the 56 page translation Taylor adds 179 pages of commentary, 14 pages of introduction, and 9 of bibliography; the index of passages cited and the general index together also total 9 spages.

The commentary is rich, readable, and often very illuminating. The topics that get the most pages include: the meaning of logos (is it "reason," or "principle"?) both in the phrase "act in accordance with correct logos" (1103b32-34 and elsewhere) and in the definition of virtue of character in II.6 (see n. 5 below); the limits to precision in the case of practical judgments; the parallels and differences between virtues and technical skills, including the distinctive agent-conditions required for action to be from virtue; virtue as a mean state; the distinction between the voluntary and the involuntary (NE III.1 gets perhaps more pages of commentary than any other chapter in NE II-IV); the object of wish; and the virtue of courage. These pages together with the commentary's many shorter notes evidence not only a lifetime of careful study but also a close consideration of much of the most recent work on these books, including the work reflected in the most recent translations of NE (named above). Readers will find things to disagree with, as I did, but will find close consideration of Taylor's commentary almost always rewarding.

The one significant drawback of the commentary, in my view, is its giving too little attention to the important structural and methodological issues introduced in my first section above, regarding the aims, structure, and methodology of Aristotle's one-by-one examination of the individual virtues from III.6 to the end of IV. Before we examine Taylor's treatment of these matters, let's review some passages in II-IV where Aristotle himself appears to be addressing some of these matters, directly or indirectly:

T1. II.7 init. 1107a28-32: This account[6] should not merely be stated universally, but should also be applied to the particulars. For in practical discussions, universal statements have wider application, but specific ones are truer. Actions are concerned with particulars, and one must agree about these.

T2. II.7 (1108a14-19): So let us treat of these too [sc. the three means that have to do with "social relations in words and action," 1108a11], so as to see even more clearly that in all cases the mean is praiseworthy but the extremes are neither praiseworthy nor correct but blameworthy. Here too most of them have no name, but we should try, as in the other cases, to coin names ourselves for the sake of clarity, to make the exposition easier to follow.

T3. II.9 fin. (1109b23-26): So much then to show that the mean state is praiseworthy in all cases, but that one should sometimes incline towards excess and sometimes towards deficiency; that way we shall most easily hit the mean and do well.

T4. III.5 fin. (1114b26-30, 1115a4-5): We have, then, spoken about the virtues collectively and outlined the kind of thing they are: namely means and states, pointing out that they are in themselves productive of the very things which give rise to them, and that they are up to us and voluntary, and that they are as correct reason prescribes.

Let us resume and, taking the virtues individually, say which each one is, and what its objects are, and how it relates to them; at the same time that will make clear how many there are.

T5. III.9 fin. (1117b20-22): This concludes our discussion of courage; it is not difficult to get an outline of it from what has been said.

T6. IV.1 fin. (1122a16-17): That concludes our discussion of generosity and its opposed vices.

T7. IV.5 fin. (1126a31-b10): What we said previously is clear also from these observations;[7] it is not easy to determine how and with whom and about what and how long one should be angry, and to specify what extent is right and what is wrong. Someone who deviates slightly in the direction of either too much or too little is not blamed; sometimes we praise those who are angry, calling them manly, since they are capable of being in control. But how big a deviation, and what kind, is blameworthy is not easy to specify by reason; for that is in the sphere of particular cases, and the judgement lies in the perception of them. But this much is clear, that the mean state is praiseworthy, in virtue of which we get angry with the people we should and about the things we should and as we should and all that, while the excesses and deficiencies are blameworthy, to a lesser extent if they are small, and more if they are bigger, and very much if they are really large. So it is clear that one should stick to the mean state. This concludes our discussion of the states to do with anger.

T8. IV.7 init. (1127a13-17): The mean between boastfulness and dissembling has to do with pretty much the same things,[8] and it too has no name. It will not be a bad idea to investigate states of that kind too; for we will acquire a fuller knowledge of the topic of character by considering it case by case, and will be more firmly convinced that the virtues are mean states when we see that that is so in every case.

It is striking how many of these passages evidence, directly or indirectly, that one aim of the review of the individual virtues is to provide support for the general account or definition of virtue of character given in II.6. This support is specifically for the differentia of that definition, the property of virtuous states of being in a mean of the relevant sort. The precise aim, according to T1, T3, and T7, is to establish that in the sphere of each virtue the mean state (and only the mean state) is praiseworthy. But for Aristotle this establishes the thesis stated explicitly in T8, that the virtues are mean states.

Aristotle explains in T1 and T8 why the review of the individual virtues is needed to accomplish this aim. The general account of the way in which virtue is a mean state, because it has to abstract from variations across the individual cases, is less "true" (T1) than the set of individual accounts of this; the body of knowledge contained in the latter is "fuller" (T8) than the knowledge conveyed in the general account.

The detailed knowledge involved in articulating the nature of the individual virtues and the variations in what we may call their "mean structure," Aristotle must hold, will significantly enhance one's ability to actually find the mean in a wide range of difficult particular situations, thereby enabling more of one's judgments as to how to act in these situations to be correct, i.e., to be true. (Thus "truer" in T1.) The articulated knowledge of both the mean and extreme states in the case of individual virtues -- including the multiple dimensions of the sphere of emotion and action in question, and the consequent different ways in which one can be either deficient or excessive, as well as other complexities -- is simply not available from the general account alone.[9]

This suggests, incidentally, that the translation of epharmottein that Taylor, like most other translators, offers in T1, "to apply it to the particulars," is misleading. Aristotle aims to do much more than merely apply an established and fully understood general truth to instances of its subject-term, thereby shedding light on those instances. He means for the careful study of the instances itself (here, the individual virtues) to provide truths that illuminate and flesh out that general account, an account that is valuable so far as it goes but is insufficient by itself to provide knowledge of what is called for in complex particular situations. The general account needs to be integrated with a distinguishable body of detailed knowledge. Rowe's translation, "show how it fits the particular cases," is an improvement.[10]

Interestingly, there is no suggestion in any of these passages that establishing that the individual character-traits discussed one by one are mean states establishes that they are virtues, nor any suggestion there where else, if anywhere else, that might be established. All of this (and other related questions) need substantial attention, if we are fully to understand the import of three Nicomachean books before us. But Taylor says very little on these matters in his commentary. On T1, for instance, he says merely that "The general account of virtue is now to be applied to the particular virtues, which are first listed along with their contrasted vices" (113), followed by a useful discussion of the terminology in this passage of "general" and "particular", and an uninspired discussion of Aristotle's use of "truer" here. And nowhere in the little he says about these eight passages is there any recognition of the significance of the questions we are now considering.

Nor, in the commentary, does Taylor say anything about the methodology Aristotle follows in his examinations of the particular virtues. Is it the sort of dialectical method so many scholars claim pervades the NE? Or are we closer to the methodology of Posterior Analytics II than to that of (e.g.) the Topics in the search for accounts of the particular virtues?[11]

Taylor's fullest discussion of these various interpretative matters comes in his Introduction.[12] Before turning to it, let me underscore what I have said above about the merits of the commentary: notwithstanding the important omission just discussed, the commentary is a highly informed, often insightful, frequently illuminating guide to very much in NEII-IV. It is a guide that will certainly repay close study, whatever one's prior level of expertise on Aristotle's ethics might be.


The bulk of Taylor's comment on this set of issues comes in a brief portion in the first section of his Introduction. The introduction is divided into two sections: 1. The Place of Books II-IV in the NE; and 2. Aristotle and Virtue Ethics. Section 1 begins by identifying the examination of excellence of character in II-IV as the first stage of the project begun in Book I of "giving an informative specification of [the best] life [for a human being]" (xi). It then interestingly traces the argument across Book I. The psychological theory endorsed in Book I leads Aristotle to a distinction between two types of excellent rational activity -- "the excellence of the intellect and the excellence of rationally responsive appetite" (xiv). Books II-IV (with V) "expound his account [of the latter]" (xv).

This leaves us [Taylor writes] with the crucial question of why we should identify the excellence of rationally responsive appetite with the virtues of character listed and discussed in Books II-IV. Aristotle['s] . . . implicit strategy relies on the reader's acceptance that, given any specific motivation such as fear or the desire for bodily pleasure, correct responsiveness to that motivation can be seen to be identical to the virtue which he specifies. The familiar criticism that in the last resort Aristotle relies on the evaluative intuitions current in his culture and social milieu, rather than attempting to ground them in any fundamental rational principle or principles, seems to be correct. (xv)

There would be such a grounding, Taylor observes, if "the ultimate standard of practical reasoning is the promotion of some goal external to that reasoning itself, such as theoretical excellence," but he refers us to works of his published elsewhere, which argue that "Aristotle's texts are indecisive on this crucial issue." Taylor takes a pass on the question of whether the absence of such a grounding would be a defect in Aristotle's ethical theory, though he cites with apparent sympathy contemporary theorists (McDowell, Wiggins, Woods) who both interpret Aristotle as "eschew[ing] any such attempt" to provide such a grounding, and "count that as a merit rather than a defect in Aristotle" (xv-xvi).

But this is much too brief a discussion of much too important a set of issues, offering much too limited a set of options. How can we tell what Aristotle's "implicit strategy" is without an examination of the explicit argumentative structure of any of the discussions of the individual virtues? Aristotle speaks of a listener's need to have been "well brought up" (1095b4-5) if he is to grasp the "starting points" of the reasoning in the study of virtue ("fine and just things," b5); but that by itself makes the discriminations of those starting points no more society-dependent than it would make logical principles, if one said that to enroll in Introduction to Philosophy a student needs to have been well brought up (by parents and prior teachers) in reasoning skills, sufficiently at least to understand the difference between an argument and an assertion. So, we need to see what Aristotle takes as starting points in the progressions of thought in the chapters on the individual virtues, and how he argues from them -- and to what. One needs to see both what Aristotle says in any given chapter in favor of the thesis that the virtuous state in question is the mean state relative to the sphere of emotion and action in question, and what he says in favor of assigning a traditional virtue-name to that trait (and how he chooses names in the nameless cases [cf. T2 and T8 above]), before we can determine what Aristotle's "strategy" is.[13]

Taylor is likewise too quick on the issue of "the ultimate standard of practical reasoning." Much of the relevant material on this topic in NE is in books other than II-IV, and to that extent outside the purview of this volume. But Books II-IV are not irrelevant to this topic: each virtue (and its corresponding vices) has a distinctive sphere of operation (1106b16-17; see also how the virtues are presented in II.7 and throughout III.6-IV), and there are presumably goods in each of these spheres, which the virtue in that sphere will best enable us to integrate into a life that meets the Book I conditions for eudaimonia.[14] And surely some of such explanation as Aristotle gives of the viciousness of individual extreme states makes reference to the cost to other goods that should be part of a good life -- in addition to the general argument from craft to virtue of character at II.6 11068-18, see, e.g., 1119a2-3, 16-20 and 1125a20-27. And some of the value Aristotle presumably puts on rational control itself[15] is probably derived from the causal role reason has in the achieving of human goods.

In mentioning these various considerations I don't mean necessarily to come down on one side or another of the question of the ultimate standard of practical reasoning for Aristotle -- the issue is indeed notoriously complex. But I do mean to suggest that there is much missing in Taylor's discussion, in the volume under review, of these matters. There are fuller discussions of some of these issues in the writings of his to which Taylor refers us (xv; cf. 110 n. 17, 246), but the discussions there are quite dense and are for the most part not specifically focused on the questions we have been considering, as those questions arise for a reader of NE II-IV. What the work under review needs is something that is, in length and density, in between what Taylor says there and what he says in his Introduction (plus 107-110), and in content more shaped to the needs of the readers of this volume.

In the longer second section of the Introduction, Taylor explores both the "links" and the "differences" between contemporary virtue ethics and Aristotle's account of virtue of character. This is one of the best discussions I know of that topic, and a useful one: the association of these two approaches is often too easily made, and yet the connections areimportant. But this reviewer would have preferred it if that discussion had been published elsewhere, and the space had been given over instead both to the insufficiently defended claims just mentioned, and to the questions regarding the review of the individual virtues I have outlined above.

Taylor's bibliography, though selective, is current and useful. The volume closes with an index of passages cited and a general index. All in all, with the one (important) caveat I've mentioned, this is a volume I am very pleased to recommend, to specialists and non-specialists alike.[16]

[1] There is already a Clarendon Aristotle volume for NE Books VIII and IX (M. Pakulak, Oxford 1998), and the series editor, Lindsay Judson, informs me that other NEvolumes are planned. For the Eudemian Ethics, we have the valuable Aristotle: Eudemian Ethics, Books I, II and VIII translated with a commentary by Michael Woods, 2nd edn. (Oxford 1992).

[2] Scholars have long struggled over the question of whether to translate the Greek word aretê as "excellence" or "virtue." In a "Preliminary Note" to the translation (1-2), Taylor makes a case for the following practice: "In contexts which discuss these features in general, or deal explicitly with both kinds [sc. those of character and those of thought or intellect], I have translated aretê as 'excellence'. In contexts, which predominate in these books, where Aristotle is discussing goodness of character and its specific types, I have translated the singular as 'virtue' and the plural (aretai) as 'virtues'." This practice of switching between two English terms is not ideal, but Taylor makes a good case for using 'virtue' rather than 'excellence' for the particular aretai. He does not explain his choice of 'excellence' for those contexts in which Aristotle is speaking more generally, but it seems clear that he thinks that 'virtue(s)' is not applicable to the dianoetikê aretai, the excellences of thought or intellect. Without meaning to come down on any side of this tricky question, I will, in what follows, for the most part follow Taylor's practice.

[3] I do not mean to slight the many other useful translations of the Nicomachean Ethics still in print that I do not cite in the body of this review. These include (among others, I suspect): D. P. Chase (Oxford 1847), F. H. Peters (Oxford 1881), J. E. C. Welldon (New York 1892), H. Rackham (Loeb 1926), M. Ostwald (Indianapolis 1962), H.G. Apostle (Grinnell, IA 1964), J.A.K. Thomson, rev. H. Tredennick (Penguin 1976), J. Sachs (Newburyport, MA 2002).

[4] The original 1925 Ross translation reads: "Virtue, then, being of two kinds, intellectual and moral, intellectual virtue in the main owes both its birth and its growth to teaching (for which reason it requires experience and time), while moral virtue comes about as a result of habit, whence also its name (êthikê) is one that is formed by a slight variation from the word ethous (habit)."

[5] Here, for instance, is the transliterated Greek and the renderings in our five translations for the famous definition of virtue of character in II.6 (1106b35-1107a2):

Estin ara hê aretê hexis proairetikê, en mesotêti ousa têi pros hêmas, horismenêi logôi kai hôi [alt. reading: hôsan ho phronimos oriseien.

Ross: Excellence, then, is a state concerned with choice, lying in a mean relative to us, this being determined by reason and in the way in which the man of practical wisdom would determine it.

[Ross (1925): Virtue, then, is a state of character concerned with choice, lying in a mean, i.e. the mean relative to us, this being determined by a rational principle, and by that principle by which the man of practical wisdom would determine it.]

Irwin: Virtue, then is a state that decides, consisting in a mean, the mean relative to us, which is defined by reference to reason, that is to say, to the reason by reference to which the prudent person would define it.

Crisp: Virtue, then, is a state involving rational choice, consisting in a mean relative to us and determined by reason -- the reason, that is, by reference to which the practically wise person would determine it.

Rowe: Excellence, then, is a disposition issuing in decisions, depending on intermediacy of the kind relative to us, this being determined by rational prescription and in the way in which the wise person would determine it.

Taylor: Virtue, then, is a state concerned with choice, in a mean in relation to us, a mean determined by reason, namely the reason by which the person of practical wisdom would determine it.

The translation of aretê aside, the issues include: (i) "state" vs. "disposition" for hexis; (ii) the translation of the term modifying hexis, viz. prohairetikê ("concerned with [or: involving] choice" vs. "that decides [or: issues in decisions]"); (iii) "mean" vs. "intermediacy"; (iv) "relative to us" vs. "in relation to us"; (v) the understanding (and translation) oflogos here; (vi) the alternative readings at 1107a1 kai hôs an or kai hôi an, and their translation ("and in the way in which" vs. "that is, by reference to which"); and (vii) the translation of phronimos (is the person so identified being said to have "practical wisdom", "prudence", or "wisdom"?).

The more substantial issues are perhaps (ii), (v), (vi), and (vii).

In re (ii) my sense in regard to the -ikê ending of prohairetikê, is that, though Aristotle does sometimes speak of virtue as a kind of agent or subject (e.g., 1107a5-6, and Karen Nielsen refers me to 1139b4-6), the Greek in the definition of virtue here does not commit him to that; so, Ross’s, Crisp’s, and Taylor's versions are to be preferred. (It's instructive that at VI. 1139b31, 1140a10, and 1140b5 where hexis gets the parallel adjectives, apodeiktikê, poiêtikê, and praktikê, Irwin and for the most part Rowe translate as Ross, Crisp, and Taylor here translate hexis prohairetikê.)

A more difficult choice here and throughout is whether to translate prohairesis as "choice" (Ross, Taylor) or "decision" (Irwin, Rowe), or in the spirit of the latter, "rational choice" (Crisp). In his glossary (s.v. decision), Irwin writes that "Many translators use 'choice' to translate [prohairesis], but this is a misleading rendering, since Aristotle allows choice (hairesis) without deliberation or decision, and such choice does not count as prohairesis" (322; see also Sarah Broadie's discussion of prohairesis in her introduction to Rowe, 42-6).

In his comment on II.5 1106a3-4, Taylor writes that "'[C]hoice' renders prohairesis, which is specifically choice or decision resulting from prior deliberation" (100, cf. 151). Elsewhere he captures this latter dimension of prohairesis via the terms "reasoned choice" (84-86) or "preferential choice" (155). I have long been a fan of "decision" over "choice" for the reasons Irwin and Broadie give, but reflecting on Taylor's translation (notwithstanding that he does not in his commentary give his reasons for preferring "choice" to "decision") opened the issue for me again. The term prohairesis emerges out of a history in which it has a broader meaning for which "choice" would not be inappropriate, and many of the associations that other translations of the term attempt to bring out are substantive claims about a certain large set of choices that should not be built into the translation. What prohairesis effectively adds to hairesis for a person of Aristotle's day is the pro-, and scholars disagree as to the prefix's significance. The issue of how best to translate prohairesis is to my mind still unresolved. (I draw here on an excellent discussion of these various matters, including the history of the term, in an unpublished paper by Karen Nielsen, to be a chapter in a book in progress on Aristotle's theory of the will, from the title of which paper -- "Aristotle's Theory of Decision" -- one can tell where she has come down.) And to the extent that the issue is unresolved, either preference is fine, so long as one identifies the issues involved and explains one's choice (or decision).

The issue in (v) is whether logos refers to a faculty or to a principle such a faculty would arrive at; in a helpful discussion (65-66) Taylor appears to endorse, and follow, Irwin in deliberately leaving open whether it refers to a faculty or a principle or both; pending a developed interpretative case for one or the other, which none of our translators give, this is surely the right course. (The fullest review of the literature and interpretative issues here that I know of is Gauthier-Jolif, L'Ethique a Nicomaque, vol. 2 [Louvain/Paris 1970], 147-50.)

(vi) According to the OCT editor Ingram Bywater, all the manuscripts at 1107a1 read kai hôs an ("and as would"), but two early Greek commentators give kai hôi an ("i.e., the one by which . . . would"), a reading Bywater accepts. Ross and Rowe follow the manuscripts; Irwin, Crisp, and Taylor follow Bywater. I always myself give a strong benefit of the doubt to a universal manuscript reading; here as in (v) (and for some of the same reasons: see Gauthier-Jolif, 149) the interpretative difference is significant, and a strong enough case could overwhelm the reading of our manuscripts, given the earlier commentary evidence. The issue is (a) whether one can articulate either the principle or the method a person of practical wisdom would use without assuming in advance who counts as a person of practical wisdom and (b) whether one could understand that principle or method without understanding quite generally and first-hand what practical wisdom is. My own view is that (a) is true but something like (b) is false, and that may also be Taylor's view: he wisely cites (109) VI. 1144b27-28: "practical wisdom itself is correct reason in these matters," and points to the substantial account of practical wisdom in Book VI; but he equally wisely writes there that "This question raises fundamental problems about the nature of the practical intellect, which go far beyond the current study." Still, one wants to leave open the possibility that (b) is false, and the Bywater reading adopted by Irwin, Crisp, and Taylor more easily does just that. And once one adopts that reading into the text, Taylor's translation is the most literal of the three.

(vii) Finally, Irwin's "prudent person" strikes me as inadequate, since "prudence" today customarily fails (especially among philosophers) to include skill at moral (or virtue-based) reasoning. (Irwin's first edition "intelligent person" is surely too broad, for several reasons.) Rowe's "wise person" would not be objectionable, given the centrality ofphronesis in Plato's writings; but that choice leaves Rowe to translate sophia in Book VI as "intellectual accomplishment", a translation which has the virtue of covering a greater range of sophia's pre-philosophical use, but not Aristotle's technical meaning. Taylor is right, then, to follow Ross and Crisp in viewing Aristotelian phronesis as "practical wisdom." (Irwin commented to me some years ago that his choices were motivated in part by the desire to translate phronesis with a single English word. There's something to be said for that, in principle, and translating phronesis as "practical wisdom" and sophia as "wisdom" may also raise questions for English readers about the relationship either between the two concepts or between the two Greek originals. My own view is that those of us who are comfortable with "practical wisdom" for phronesis think of it as a single concept, the words in effect hyphenated, and teach it that way. And, as for the matter of the relationship, and the history, of the Greek terms, one can address that with one's Greekless readers or students, when one addresses, as everyone must, the theoretical relationship, and the history, of the Aristotelian concepts of phronesis and sophiathemselves.)

Indeed, I'm willing to say that in his rendering of Aristotle's definition of virtue of character Taylor bats nearly 1.000 (or whatever the cricket counterpart to a perfect score might be), since I also prefer (i) "state" to "disposition" in stressing a hexis' occurrent status, (iii) "mean" to "intermediacy" (even if I recognize a discordant note in speaking of virtue as a "mean state" and appreciate here the phrase "intermediate state"), since "doctrine of the mean" has such a long history; and I think that (iv) "in relation to us" is a gem of an improvement over "relative to us", losing immediately all the wrong connotations of the latter.

[6] Gk. touto, no noun. "This account": sc. of virtue of character, in particular as "a mean between two vices, one of excess and one of deficiency" (II.6 1107a2-3, which immediately follows upon the definition of virtue of character we have examined in the previous note).

[7] "Observations": legomena, lit. "things said". The other translations are all better in not attributing (advertently or inadvertently) an epistemological source to what has just been said. Rowe is perhaps the most literal: "But what we said in our previous discussions is also clear from the present one." (The reference to what we stated previously is to 1109b14-23, where the wording is very close to the wording here.)

[8] "Has to do with pretty much the same things": sc. as does the unnamed virtue that most resembles friendliness (cf. 1127a18-20), viz. "social relations in words and action" (1108a11). Taylor refers us back to the whole of 1108a9-30 (our T2 above), a passage also of interest for its indication of the value of studying unnamed virtues in particular, a topic that likewise could get more attention than Taylor gives it. (On the matter of the study of unnamed virtues, see the article cited in n. 11 below.)

[9] Cf. Broadie, in Rowe (24): "Nothing in Aristotle's general account of character-excellence prepares us for the complexity of courage, which turns out to be intermediate in respect of two continua . . ."

[10] In the important opening passage of Aristotle's De Motu Animalium, at 698a14, the translation of epharmottein as "applies to" would also be incorrect. Here too, the general truth has to be integrated with what is discovered independently about the particular kinds. (Farquharson translates "harmonize with" [Oxford transl., 1912]; Nussbaum "be in harmony with" [Aristotle: De Motu Animalium, Princeton 1978]; Preus "agree with" [Aristotle and Michael of Ephesus on the Movement and Progression of Animals, Hildesheim 1981].) Andrea Falcon (citing J. Barnes' review of Nussbaum, Classical Quarterly 30 (1980), 223) has pointed out to me that the general or common account is said by Aristotle in that passage to be pursued on account of (dia + accusative; not "through," as some mistranslate it) our concern to grasp the particular cases. This is a very important, undernoted passage, but it should not be taken (nor does Falcon take it) to suggest that the bulk of the epistemic work is done by the general account.

[11] Important recent work indeed supports the latter: see Gregory Salmieri, "Aristotle's Non-Dialectical Methodology in the Nicomachean Ethics," Ancient Philosophy 29 (forthcoming 2009).

[12] Taylor's comment on the definition of virtue of character in II.6 (107-110) is relevant to these matters; we'll turn to it in connection with the portion of his Introduction in which he connects that comment to these matters.

[13] On this too, see Salmieri, forthcoming 2009 (above n. 11), from which any discussion of Aristotle's "strategy" here should take off.

[14] See the connection made between virtue of character and the human good at the opening of II.6. (Notice by the way that here, and also in I.7 where the human good is connected with manifesting the human function excellently, the standard for excellence is derived not from independent normative considerations but from the contribution that this function itself makes to the good it serves.) See also, e.g., John Cooper's discussion of the relation of virtue and the various goods, including the external (and more generally the "natural") goods , and of other matters related to the questions we are considering, in his Reason and Human Good in Aristotle (Cambridge, MA 1975; Indianapolis 1986), chs. 1 and (esp.) 2. Taylor himself, in his discussion on p. 109, raises the possibility of a connection between virtue and a determinate human good, but in characterizing such a good mentions only "a life in which theoretical activity is the agent's supreme goal."

[15] See T. Irwin, Aristotle's First Principles (Oxford 1989), ch. 17.

[16] My thanks to Jim Lennox, Karen Nielsen, and Greg Salmieri for comments which improved an earlier draft, and to Gary Gutting for his patience. I regret the late appearance of this review, the responsibility for which is entirely mine.