Niels Bohr and the Philosophy of Physics: Twenty-First-Century Perspectives

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Jan Faye and Henry J. Folse (eds.), Niels Bohr and the Philosophy of Physics: Twenty-First-Century Perspectives, Bloomsbury, 2017, 384pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781350035126.

Reviewed by Brian Hepburn, Wichita State University


This is a handsome, well-edited, fascinating volume with a subject that is remarkable in at least two ways. Firstly, it is striking that now, even after a century, there should be so much to say about Bohr's interpretation of quantum mechanics (or interpretations, as might be the lesson of this book). This is especially remarkable given that there was already the centenary volume of Bohr's birth (which was 1885, though the volume, also edited by Jan Faye and Henry J. Folse, came out in 1994). In their introduction, the editors seem to characterize this as a sequel to the 1994 collection. It is a testament to the richness of Bohr's thought and the thoroughness of Bohr scholarship that this volume does not feel redundant or repetitive.

The second remarkable thing is that Bohr's thinking, his explanations, his "interpretation", or "framework" -- the various characterizations of the contributors -- should feel so relevant. It is one thing to look back on a philosopher's work and attempt new interpretations, or proffer new readings perhaps more consistent with some newly discovered archival detail. It is another to put that philosophy in the category of a living, ongoing programme. This volume presents both kinds of Bohr scholarship, doing so successfully and programmatically; the book is divided into two major parts, accordingly.

The first eight essays discuss Bohr's philosophical background, and the history of his thought, its reception, and our evolving understanding of them. These essays offer helpful clarifications of Bohr's concepts, complementarity and correspondence in particular. Nearly all of them also help clarify how Bohr's concepts can be read into an overall system for understanding quantum mechanics. A common theme is to emphasize reading Bohr as an experimentalist or pragmatic philosopher (e.g. Maximillian Schlosshauer and Kristian Camilleri, Mauro Dorato, Henry J. Folse, Jan Faye, Arkady Plotnitsky, Slobodan Perović); another is to point to Kantian or transcendental themes (Michel Bitbol, Patricia Kauark-Leite). Despite these rival-sounding readings, both make sense of Bohr's insistence on classical language for describing quantum phenomena without requiring a commitment to some robust metaphysical cut between classical and quantum worlds. Bohr seems far less obscure and far more sensible as a result.

The editors each have a contribution on complementarity: Folse's compares Bohr with the pragmatism of C.I. Lewis; Faye's connects complementarity with human nature. Indeed, complementarity -- the central and, some would argue, obscure concept of Bohr's philosophy of science -- is also central to the volume. It is mentioned in every chapter. Also central is Bohr's correspondence principle.

There are eight essays in the section "Bohr's Interpretation of Quantum Mechanics in Twenty-First-Century Physics". The contributors propound the more provocative proposal to read Bohr's philosophy as it applies to recent empirical results and physical theories -- results and theories which, for the most part, did not occur until, or had major developments after, Bohr's death. This section looks at, as the editors put it, "how Bohr's interpretation fares with respect to a variety of issues that have arisen only since his lifetime." (p.11)

There is a further distinction to be made between two ways in which Bohr's thought could continue to be relevant in the 21st century. One is by contributing to the philosophy of science and to our understanding of how physics has proceeded since Bohr's lifetime. The other is to argue that Bohr's philosophy of science, and his way of thinking as a physicist, continues to play a role in the development of physics itself, even in recent important discoveries. Both types of arguments are made in the book. The contributions in this second section argue for various ways in which Bohr's philosophy can be seen as a living programme. I will briefly discuss the arguments from two of these chapters.

In chapter 8, Plotnitsky considers Bohr in both the 20th and 21st century. Although this chapter comes at the end of the first section, it is nevertheless well placed, since it deals with historical and contemporary aspects of Bohr. Plotnitsky describes a continuity between Bohr's influence in the 20th century, during his lifetime, and into the 21st century as well. The chapter contributes to our understanding of Bohr's place in the history of QM and attempts to illustrate his continued contribution, in particular, to the discovery of the Higg's boson. Specifically, Plotnitsky argues that the event of the discovery of the Higg's boson "confirms the understanding of quantum theory . . . in the 'spirit of Copenhagen,' initiated by Bohr's thinking." (p.179)

What Plotnitsky seems to mean by 'the spirit of Copenhagen' is what he calls Bohr's technological understanding where 'technology' is construed in the broad, Heideggerian sense which includes mathematics, for example, and theory, as well as the usual experimental apparatus. The Higg's discovery obviously required all three.

According to Plotnitsky,  there is a second aspect to the spirit of Copenhagen that has played an important role in our understanding of quantum mechanics, a recognition of what he calls fragmentation and multiplicity. Fragmentation and multiplicity are linked with Bohr's complementarity principle. (There is also a somewhat extended discussion here of James' psychology, cubism, Husserl and others as illustrations of the breadth of application of the concept of complementarity.) What is fragmentary is that quantum experimental results cannot be united in a single picture but must, in Bohr's own words "be regarded as complementary in the sense that only the totality of the phenomena exhausts the possible information about the objects." (p.183 from Bohr 1958/1987b, p.40) Choosing which experiment to perform is choosing which part of the complementary picture we get -- which fragment. The spirit of complementarity recognizes the importance of the technology involved, in any form which affects that fragmentation. This includes not only the apparatus, but the mathematical framework and the choice of representation.

In the end, Plotnitsky's story of Bohr in the 21st century is that the epistemological aspects of quantum field theory, which have remained in place since Heisenberg and Bohr, are confirmed by the discovery of the Higg's boson (and by Dirac's discovery of antimatter, and the discovery of the pentaquark, p.197). This in turn confirms the continued role of Bohr's complementarity concept as the source of those epistemological aspects. This is more plausible as a way of understanding the events than as an account of the role of the concept of complementarity in the discoveries themselves: i.e. the role of Bohr's interpretation in understanding the events, as opposed to the role in the events themselves.

A claim like the stronger one is made, however, in Perović's contribution. Perović, looking at investigations into quantum tunnelling, both in the past in the work of Hund and Nordheim, but ongoing in attempts to measure tunnelling times, states that Bohr's complementarity framework is not only of historical interest but, rather, continues to provide a "useful methodological guideline . . . invaluable in the context of novel experimental research." (p.220)

Perović asks two questions:

1. was the complementarity approach, both as a method and as a theoretical standpoint, also a guide for the study of unexplored phenomena at the time, and how exactly did it perform such a function?

2. Does and can complementarity play the same useful role today . . . with respect to not fully understood phenomena subject to ongoing experimental research? (p.209)

The answer is yes in both cases, according to Perović. In explaining how, he makes clear his particular interpretation of complementarity as a methodological guideline. The general idea is that novel research requires an openness to disparate theoretical approaches, each with complementary strengths -- "competing frameworks, each accounting better than the other for particular isolated phenomena." (p.213) -- and limits, namely that no single theoretical approach can account for all experimental phenomena. Examples Perović provides are the roles that wave mechanics and matrix mechanics played in investigations of alpha particle decay, or the number of experimental frameworks for conceiving and measuring tunnelling velocity.

The complementarity methodology is a two-stage experimental process of (1) gathering experimental results (including descriptions, necessarily, in the language of classical physics); and (2) an interpretive stage, making theoretical sense of the experimental results (possibly, as in the case of quantum mechanics, in terms conflicting with one another, and with our intuitions and with classical physics.)

Complementarity is a methodological programme for QM, meant to honor both stages. Whether this methodological programme amounts to a "strong methodological force" (p.216) or (in the more tempered characterization Perović uses later) merely a "useful methodological guideline" (p.220), is a matter of judgment not clearly settled in the chapter. Boiled down to a methodological guideline, absent a metaphysical moral or implication, complementarity may amount to the injunction not to be dogmatic about any one particular theoretical approach.

This a general worry the reader might have about the volume: that in attempting to remove the obscurity of Bohr's philosophy, it has either been rendered unoriginal or been given incompatible interpretations. The common themes which run throughout the chapters mitigate the second worry. As for the first, the proof is in the breadth and interest of the volume. The overall effect is an encouraging one. It reaffirms the continuing importance of philosophical reflection on the quantum picture, however fragmented, or especially because of how fragmented, it is.


Bohr, N., Essays 1958-1962 on Atomic Physics and Human Knowledge, Wiley, 1958. Reprinted as The Philosophical Writings of Niels Bohr, Vol. 3, Ox Bow Press, 1987b. (Note: this reference is found on p.65 of the volume.)