Nietzsche and Rée: A Star Friendship

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Robin Small, Nietzsche and Rée: A Star Friendship, Oxford University Press, 2005, 272 pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199278075.

Reviewed by Paul S. Loeb, University of Puget Sound


English-speaking readers of Nietzsche are acquainted with his final assessment of his former friend and philosophical partner, Paul Rée. He is the genealogist of morals in whose upside-down and perverse hypotheses we find the entertaining confluence of the Darwinian beast and the ultramodern, unassuming, moral milksop who no longer bites (GM P:4, 7). These same readers, deeply influenced by the English style of thinking that Nietzsche blamed for misleading Reé, have often agreed with Rée's final assessment of his former friend and philosophical partner: a crazy poet, rich in spirit but poor in thought, whose moral thought is a mixture of insanity and nonsense (Rée, p. xlvii).

In a striking and elegant choice, Robin Small looks to Nietzsche's Gay Science aphorism 279 for the subtitle of his new study on the seven-year-long close personal and philosophical relationship between Nietzsche and Rée. In this aphorism, which Lou Salomé thought was about Rée, Nietzsche expresses the hope that he and his estranged friend will believe in their star friendship even if they are compelled to be earth enemies: "There is probably a tremendous but invisible stellar orbit in which our different ways and goals may be included as small parts of this path: let us rise up to this thought. But our life is too short and our power of vision too small for us to be more than friends in the sense of this sublime possibility." Most scholars have thought that Nietzsche had Wagner in mind here, and it is perhaps implausible that he could have meant Rée since he wrote this before they became estranged. Nevertheless, well equipped with over a century's hindsight, Small succeeds admirably in charting a larger swath of the stellar orbit in which the different ways and goals of Nietzsche and Rée should be included.

Darwin is the center of this orbit. In his detailed recounting of the rise and fall of the Nietzsche-Rée intellectual collaboration, Small shows how Rée's idea of applying Darwin to ethics first drew them together and how Nietzsche's critique of Darwin's ethics eventually pushed them apart.

As Small rightly emphasizes, Rée should be credited for his pioneering work in evolutionary ethics and psychology. In the concluding essay of his first (anonymously) published book, Psychological Observations (1875), Rée aims to understand a phenomenon noted by French moralists like La Rochefoucauld: Why is vanity, the desire to gain the approval of others, so prevalent, especially since it seems to do us more harm than good? Citing The Origin of Species, Rée proposes that Darwin's theory of sexual selection with respect to animal instincts should be extended to offer a naturalistic explanation. As Small summarizes, "[Rée] argues that the advantage provided by gaining the good opinion of others favours the desire for approval and praise, so that it is not only passed on but becomes steadily stronger in every generation as the cycle of variation, selection, and inheritance is repeated" (p. xvii). For Nietzsche, Rée's concluding essay pointed toward the idea of a new historical, naturalistic and scientific approach to moral phenomena. The main concern of the approach, Small explains, "is an earlier development which it claims to be forgotten and hidden, and so ascertainable only through indirect evidence. In this dramatic extension of the backward-looking perspective, it is far closer to the theories of Lyell and Darwin, which lengthened the timescales of scientific theorizing in geology and biology into 'deep time'" (pp. 71-72).

In perhaps the most interesting biographical section of his study, Small relates the autumn of 1876 in which Nietzsche and Rée worked together in Sorrento and produced their next books, The Origin of the Moral Sensations (1877) and Human, All-Too-Human (1878). The closeness of their partnership is evident in Rée's inscription to Nietzsche, "To the father of this work most gratefully from its mother" (p. 33); and in Nietzsche's note to Rée concerning his own book (published ten months later), "It belongs to you -- to others it is only given" (Rée, p. xxxiv). As previous admirers of Schopenhauer, both Rée and Nietzsche found in Darwin a theoretically economical and comprehensive alternative to Schopenhauer's metaphysical and supersensible explanation of moral phenomena. This is why, in section 37 of Human, All-Too-Human, Nietzsche singles out for praise Rée's programmatic announcement at the start of The Origin of the Moral Sensations: "Admittedly, before the theory of evolution appeared, many of these [moral] phenomena could not be explained by immanent causes, and a transcendent explanation is certainly far more satisfying than -- none at all. Yet today, since Lamarck and Darwin have written, moral phenomena can be traced back to natural causes just as much as physical phenomena: moral man stands no closer to the intelligible world than physical man" (Rée, p. 87).

In addition to restating and expanding his earlier explanation of vanity, Rée turns in his second book to examine the origin of other moral phenomena: good and evil, conscience, responsibility, and justice. As Small notes, Rée's central discussion follows Darwin in proposing group selection as the origin of selfless or unegoistic human behavior. In The Descent of Man (1870-71), Darwin concedes that such behavior would seem disadvantageous for the individual, but argues: "There can be no doubt that a tribe including many members who, from possessing in a high degree the spirit of patriotism, fidelity, obedience, courage, and sympathy, were always ready to aid one another, and to sacrifice themselves for the common good, would be victorious over most other tribes; and this would be natural selection." (Rée, p. xxx). As Small also emphasizes, however, it was Ree's original contribution to point out that Darwin's account did nothing to explain "the process through which the social instincts in many species take a particular form in human beings by being expressed in the concepts of morality" (p. 90).

In order to explain this further process, Rée postulates precisely the origin of the concept 'good' that Nietzsche targets at the start his Genealogy: "Originally one approved unegoistic actions and called them good from the point of view of those to whom they were done, that is to say, those to whom they were useful; later one forgot how this approval originated and, simply because unegoistic actions were always habitually praised as good, one also felt them to be good -- as if they were something good in themselves" (GM I:2).

Although Nietzsche later criticizes every aspect of Rée's "English-inspired" utilitarian and associationist psychology, Small shows how Nietzsche himself had embraced this psychology in the works he produced during his collaboration with Rée. In section 40 of The Wanderer and his Shadow (1880), for example, Nietzsche writes that "actions, whose basic motive, that of utility, has been forgotten, are then called moral actions" (p. 33; cf. also HAH 39). Indeed, Small recounts, Nietzsche's friends, family, and students were all quite startled to find Rée exerting such an influence upon the author of The Birth of Tragedy. His close friend Erwin Rohde wrote to Nietzsche: "Can one remove one's soul and replace it with another? Instead of Nietzsche now suddenly become Rée?" (p. 32). And recalling their collaboration in Sorrento, Rée himself wrote to Nietzsche about Human, All-Too-Human: "I see my own self projected externally on a greater scale" (p. 38). To which Nietzsche replied, somewhat sardonically: "All my friends are now agreed that my book comes from and is written by you: so I congratulate you on this new authorship … Long live Réealism and my good friend!" (Rée, p. xxxviii).

We should not trust Nietzsche, then, when he recalls reading Rée's Origin of Moral Sensations and saying to himself No, proposition by proposition, conclusion by conclusion (GM P:4). As Small observes, Nietzsche's frustration with the reaction to Human, All-Too-Human gave him plenty of motive to distance himself from Rée and to deny Rée's influence upon the development of his thought. Nevertheless, Nietzsche was right to point out that already in Human, All-Too-Human he had refused to follow Rée -- who had himself followed Schopenhauer and Darwin -- in simply identifying the altruistic mode of evaluation with moral evaluation as such (GM P:4). As a consequence of his increasingly critical approach to morality, Nietzsche came to believe that Rée's genealogy of moral concepts was fatally compromised by his failure to question this unconscious allegiance to altruistic morality (GS 345). Indeed, as Small points out, Nietzsche found such an allegiance even in Darwin's appeal to the evolutionary concept of group selection: "The well-being of the majority and the well-being of the few are opposite viewpoints of value: to consider the former a priori of higher value may be left to the naïveté of English biologists" (GM I: Note). So, Nietzsche charges, Rée was deluded in thinking that he had criticized conventional moral language by "showing it to be a misleading form of expression which represents a 'forgetting' of origins" (p. 92). Instead of conducting an investigation into the actual origin of the word 'good', Rée unwittingly fabricated a blue-sky history that linked this origin from the start and by necessity to unegoistic actions -- thereby supporting and shielding from criticism the English and Darwinist plebeianism of the modern spirit (Loeb, pp. 132 ff).

This is a very timely book. Much of the current interest in Nietzsche, and some of the best recent scholarship, concerns questions of his naturalism, his stance toward Darwin, his historical and genealogical method, his critique of morality, and his moral psychology. Small's erudite study shows us how these aspects of Nietzsche's thought originated, how they developed, and how they themselves came under his critical scrutiny. Although Small expertly draws our attention to other important influences on this arc of Nietzsche's career -- for example, Democritus, African Spir, Walter Bagehot, and especially Herbert Spencer -- he demonstrates the preeminence of Paul Rée. In this review I have focused on Small's account of the philosophical partnership between Nietzsche and Rée, and in particular on his discussion of the role of Darwin in this partnership. But readers will also learn from Small's penetrating analysis of their shared ideas on freedom, character, and punishment; from his judicious and psychologically insightful review of their personal friendship (including the famous "Lou affair"); and from his aesthetically discerning treatment of the influence of Rée's aphoristic style on what is often regarded as Nietzsche's original stylistic invention.

In summing up the goal of his study, Small writes of "restoring the working relationship with Rée to its proper place in Nietzsche's career as a thinker" and of "doing justice to both the changes of direction and the continuities in [Nietzsche's] development, as well as to the subtler overlaps between the 'periods' that commentators have identified" (p. 217). Small certainly accomplishes his goal, and, together with his translation and edition of Rée's basic writings, he here expands upon his already substantial contribution (see Small 2001) to the excellent and growing scholarship on the context of Nietzsche's thought.

Highly recommended. This book will be of interest to general readers, undergraduates, graduates, and scholars in the field.


Paul S. Loeb, "Is There a Genetic Fallacy in Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals?" International Studies in Philosophy 27:3 (1995).

Paul Rée, Basic Writings, edited and translated by Robin Small. Urbana: University of Illinois Press, 2003.

Robin Small, Nietzsche in Context. Aldershot: Ashgate, 2001.