Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality: A Critical Guide

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Simon May (ed.), Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morality: A Critical Guide, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 345pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521518802.

Reviewed by Martin Saar, Universität Hamburg, and Hannah Grosse Wiesmann, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin


This collection of essays belongs to a series dedicated to classical philosophical works that tries to document major trends in current scholarship. There has been an enormous amount of publication on Nietzsche's work recently, and the Genealogy of Morality from 1887 has in the last decade definitely emerged as the work most commented on. In the Anglophone world, there have been some excellent collections that continue to influence the discussion, and this new volume closely follows up on the most recent developments.1 It definitely maintains the high standard and without exception presents excellent, accessible and thoroughly researched examples of state-of-the-art Nietzsche scholarship. It covers a wide range of interpretative and systematic questions arising from Nietzsche's critique of morality in general and the text of the Genealogy in particular. While Nietzsche spends some time in the preface explaining his intentions and methodological principles, his philosophical and historical arguments in the three sections of the work resist an easy grasp on the question of what genealogy (as a method or procedure) really is and how it amounts to, or at least contributes to, a "critique of moral values" (GM, Pref., 6).2

Peter Kail explores genealogy as a philosophical methodology, maintaining that it is "primarily an explanatory account of the emergence of some distinctive set of beliefs, practices and associated phenomena" (214), which involve agents with a particular psychology in a situation to which that psychology is responsive. Kail supports this claim by showing what Nietzsche has in common with those he dismissively calls the 'English psychologists'. He then discusses some of genealogy's consequences, arguing that it is a naturalistic but non-reductive form of understanding, which does not have normative effects simply in virtue of its being a genealogy. He rejects the idea that genealogy constitutes an 'internal' or 'immanent' critique of morality or a 'revaluation of values', and shows that the normative effect of genealogy consists in destabilizing moral values, which means that it has a merely preparatory function for the 'revaluation of values'.

Paul Katsafanas also is concerned with the form of critique Nietzsche is engaged in. Genealogy, he claims, is dependent on a view that gives power "a privileged normative status" (177) because of its link to agency. If it can be shown that morality undermines our power or agency because it "systematically obfuscates the connection between perceptions of power and actual power" (181), it has to be rejected. Nietzsche tries to show this for the traditional, Judeo-Christian interpretation of morality, and this project, Katsafanas claims has, for methodological reasons, to take a historical form: first, because only a perspective on the emergence and establishment of this interpretation can explain its long-lasting and persistent character; second, because Nietzsche "needs to employ competing perspectives on manifestations of power" (188).

Nadeem Hussain discusses the substantial function of the concept of life for Nietzsche's genealogy and shows how it structures his many critiques. Underlying his 'will to power' doctrine lies a substantive "doctrine about what is essential to life", namely "a tendency towards expansion, growth, domination, overcoming of resistance, increasing strength and so on" (153); and this is Nietzsche's standard or criterion for evaluating forms of life. Traditional morality denies these tendencies and is therefore denying life. The right 'natural' attitude to life then is to affirm this natural condition. Hussain adds that he doesn't think one can "philosophically defend this inference" [169], but that he has shown that this is the way Nietzsche, like many other nineteenth-century naturalists, thought.

Lawrence Hatab focuses on the relation between master and slave morality in the first part of GM, asking how it became possible that master morality surrendered its power and was supplanted by slave morality. Possible explanations for the decline of master morality in his view include the growing domestication of culture, an exhaustion of externalized forms of power, and the novel attractions of internalized power, such as Socratic dialectic. Hatab then fleshes out the ambiguities inherent to the master-slave-distinction, showing that the turn to slave morality in Nietzsche's view not only endangered but also enhanced cultural life by a creative redirection of power that brought about higher culture. Finally, he argues that what Nietzsche hopes for in overcoming the tradition's life-averse character "is not a return to master morality, but the self-overcoming of the tradition, a cultural renovation that is possible only by way of the tradition's overcoming of original master morality." (213)

Starting from a similar textual basis, R. Lanier Anderson gives a close reading of several crucial passages in GM, I, to prove that for Nietzsche it remains clear that the priests, however ambiguous their role in the "slave revolt in morality" (introduced in GM, I, 7), are themselves instances of the noble character type. Anderson refutes recent accounts that attribute them to an intermediary role or even take them to be some kinds of slaves. He presents textual evidence that Nietzsche (at least for the most part in this context) indeed insists that the values originating in the "slave revolt" are invented and put into use by the priests. They are "creator[s] of slave values" (41), but not slaves themselves, even if they, as Anderson has to admit, are those nobles who -- in Nietzsche's semi-fictional historical scenario -- lose out to the more brutal and initially more effective 'warrior nobles'.

Raymond Geuss makes yet another attempt to interpret Nietzsche's observations about the origin of our moral vocabulary in GM, I, and specifically the idea that the good/bad distinction was gradually 'moralized' and turned into a good/evil dichotomy. Geuss claims Nietzsche is implying that this was just one route history could take; there might be a different development, one making space for a "revaluation" or "post-Nietzschean concept of 'evil'" (22). The problem for Nietzsche lies not in the concept of "evil" as such but in the function it was and is playing in moral discourse, namely tapping into the desire to take revenge on those who do harm.

In his rich and densely written contribution Peter Poellner revisits the connection between morality and ressentiment, arguably the most basic element of Nietzsche's genealogical critique of morality, prominent in GM, II. Against many other readings he holds that ressentiment should be seen as an "intentional project" (125) and not as relying on subconscious motives, and that it essentially includes "object mastery" -- it seeks the active suppression of others. Morality, as Nietzsche sees it, then indeed relies on a specific kind of half-conscious self-misunderstanding or "intentional self-deception" (136); it only appears peaceful and benevolent. While this already seems enough to discredit morality, Nietzsche's ultimate rejection of it is even stronger: ressentiment is bad in itself since it ties the self to something it is not and undermines real or "authentic" acts of evaluation; it therefore not only contingently but "intrinsically aims at 'bad ends'" (141).

Bernard Reginster retraces the account of the origins of the feeling of guilt given by Nietzsche in the second essay. He argues that Nietzsche's inquiry focuses on the specifically Christian feeling of guilt and -- as opposed to the major line of interpretation -- holds the view that Nietzsche's objective is not "to challenge the non-naturalistic account of the feeling of guilt promoted by the Christian outlook (namely, guilt as a manifestation of 'the voice of God in man') but to show that the Christian representation of guilt is not an account of the ordinary feeling of guilt . . . but a perversion of it, which results from its exploitation as an instrument of self-directed cruelty" (57).  Reginster therefore considers Christian guilt to be a "rational passion" (57), that is, a passion which essentially exploits a rational being's responsiveness to reason, and which, "unlike other passions, not only overrides, but actually corrupts, this responsiveness" (57).

Brian Leiter approaches the figure of the "sovereign individual" (GM, II, 2), asking who this figure is and what it has to do with Nietzsche's conceptions of free will, freedom, or the self. Leiter calls into question a recent scholarly consensus according to which the figure of the "sovereign individual" is connected with a positive theory of human freedom or autonomous selfhood. By contrast, he argues for the view that, first, Nietzsche denies that we ever act freely and that we are morally responsible for our actions; second, that the figure of the 'sovereign individual' in no way contradicts this first point; and, third, that Nietzsche engages in a 'persuasive definition' of 'freedom' and 'free will' that radically revises the content of these concepts while exploiting their positive emotive valence for the reader. More precisely, Leiter aims to show, as his earlier work has argued at length, that the figure of the 'sovereign individual' is consistent with the understanding of Nietzsche as a kind of fatalist.

In one of the most original essays of the volume, Simon May spars with Nietzsche's ideal of a world free of morality, claiming that the Genealogy's success in overcoming morality is restrained by Nietzsche's conviction that suffering must be given a meaning. Although, in May's view, the new meaning for suffering that Nietzsche seeks is one no longer structured by the ascetic ideal, Nietzsche remains within morality and cannot attain a life-affirming stance as long as he even poses the question of the meaning of suffering. Against this background, May proposes that to genuinely affirm one's life is "to take joy in its 'there-ness' or quiddity as a whole -- a whole conceived as necessary (or fated) in all its elements and experienced as beautiful." (10) In tracing the development of Nietzsche's thought on the justification of suffering throughout his writings, May shows that Nietzsche moves towards such an attitude, especially with regard to the concept of amor fati, but that in GM he stops midway.

In a more general vein, Christine Swanton argues that the concern about Nietzsche's ideal of egoism, which, as is often suggested, makes him unattractive to modern moral sensibilities, is misplaced. Indeed, she challenges the view of Nietzsche as a proponent of an immoral form of egoism by reading his conception of virtues of character as those of the 'mature egoist'. In order to elaborate a proper understanding of the mature egoism endorsed by Nietzsche in GM, she reconstructs several virtues characteristic of this kind of egoism -- namely assertiveness, justice, objectivity, mature generosity, independence/self-sufficiency, discipline -- and their correlative vices.

Edward Harcourt discusses the question whether Nietzsche can be criticized for advocating 'aestheticism' or an 'aesthetics of character', supposedly an a-moral or anti-ethical commitment. Distinguishing several strategies to explain the aesthetic nature of such a position, Harcourt comes to a rather sobering conclusion: nothing Nietzsche seems to be committed to as valuable or excellent in a life or person seems to relate necessarily to anything aesthetic in the narrow sense. Not even his insistence on shape-giving or form qualifies Nietzsche's conception of a character, which definitely is most often articulated as an 'ideal of health', as distinctively aesthetic: "If we were to capture what, if anything, is special about Nietzsche's ideal of character, therefore, we are unlikely to help ourselves if we continue to reach for the 'aesthetic' label." (283)

Aaron Ridley follows the traces of Nietzsche's scattered remarks on beauty in GM, which mostly take the form of a rejection of Kant's, Schopenhauer's and Stendhal's visions of this value. Distinguishing between 'interested' (or impersonal) and 'disinterested' as well as between 'spectatorial-' and artist- or creator-oriented accounts of art, Nietzsche rejects the three alternative accounts. Ridley shows how this strategy relies on Nietzsche's more general conception of different 'noble' or 'slavish' types of valuation. But the "fully noble form of beauty" (316) then, Ridley concludes, would commit Nietzsche to understanding artistic creativity as "a peculiarly intense form of self-celebration" (321), solipsistic and monological. And this, he contends, is neither tenable, as Nietzsche himself seems to notice, nor systematically attractive.

In an essay that refreshingly differs in style from the other, more standard academic papers, Stephen Mulhall follows some hints Nietzsche has laid out in the opening section of GM. The enigmatic remarks that the different sections of the book can be read as interpretations of certain aphorisms in his other texts and the insistence on the conditions of readability show that Nietzsche was highly aware of the very language and linguistic acts in which the genealogical 'truths' may be presented. Mulhall argues for a reading that shows that this involves the reader's experiences as well as Nietzsche's own. Nietzsche, then, in the text somehow confronts his own current self, still in the grip of the very forces of morality to be overcome, with some future, possible, 'freer' self. The genealogy as a text therefore combines "at once modes of confession and modes of prophecy" (263).

As these summaries show, the range of topics is wide, and most issues central to GM are given a fair treatment. Not surprisingly, recent discussions are still circling around the question whether the genealogical mode of argumentation is essentially historical or not (compare Katsafanas and Geuss to Kail or Hussain), or whether Nietzsche provides us with substantial alternatives to the 'decadent' and 'weak' forms of life he is attacking, or whether his account remains more or less negative (compare Swanton to Leiter). Another question is whether Nietzsche tries to overcome morality as such or only its life-negating forms. In advocating the ideal of an affirmative stance free of any moral valuation (as May does), however, one might fall short of Nietzsche's conception of yes-saying as in itself an act of creation of values, which could lead to a new understanding of a different, 'higher' morality as a life-affirming attitude.

In general, Nietzsche here appears mainly as a sort of social psychologist with deep insights into the dynamics of social interaction (see Reginster or Poellner), performing some kind of ideology critique.  Interestingly, to explain this strategy, neither the 'will to power' doctrine nor the 'eternal recurrence' conception, arguably the most metaphysical elements of Nietzsche's thought, are given much weight, and this also distinguishes the more recent interpretations from earlier phases in the debate. There is a considerable dispute as to whether his methodology makes Nietzsche a real, whole-hearted naturalist or whether it leaves room for the irreducibility of interpretation and meaning (compare Leiter and Hussain to Kail and Reginster).

Despite the chapters on beauty and aesthetics, not much is said about Nietzsche's style and argumentation; and surprisingly quite a number of contributors really try to give a quite 'realist', psychological reading of Nietzsche's 'nobles' vs. 'slaves' scenario (see Anderson, Poellner and Hatab), which might be interpreted much more metaphorically or allegorically. Here it might have been productive to take into account the sources from which Nietzsche actually took his anthropological and historical views (from Jacob Burkhardt to W. E. H. Lecky).

Unfortunately, the volume might give the impression that Nietzsche scholarship is (almost) a men's world, which, of course, it isn't. And for better or for worse, there are not many references to non-Anglophone scholarship. This also sheds some light on what at first appears as a major strength of this collection, namely its reflection of a dense and vibrant discussion among the authors.  This can easily turn into a vice when the discussion appears slightly self-referential and essays start from minor points made by the other contributors in some recent text. But this might be excused given that Nietzsche himself was never shy of citing himself.

Which Nietzsche, then, are we left with for the next decade? This volume suggests it is not the metaphysician, the intellectual adventurer, visionary or advocate of a 'future philosophy' we should concentrate on, but the sober, quasi-naturalist, cold-blooded critic of culture, value and present self-(mis)understandings. One could imagine this not being the last word on Nietzsche's philosophical legacy, but for the time being it makes a strong case for a view of Nietzsche that still means trouble to most current forms of moral philosophy.

1 Richard Schacht (ed.), Nietzsche, Genealogy, History: Essays on Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals, University of California Press, 1994; Brian Leiter and Neil Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality, Oxford University Press, 2007; Ken Gemes and Simon May (eds.), Nietzsche on Freedom and Autonomy, Oxford University Press, 2009.

2 Quotations from Nietzsche are from the translation by Maudemarie Clark and Alan J. Swenson, published as On the Genealogy of Morality, Hackett, 1998 (cited as "GM"), Latin numbers (I, II, III) refer to the "essays" or "treatises" and to the respective paragraphs.