Nietzsche's Life Sentence: Coming to Terms with Eternal Recurrence

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Lawrence Hatab, Nietzsche's Life Sentence: Coming to Terms with Eternal Recurrence, Routledge, 2005, 208pp, $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415967597

Reviewed by Julian Young, University of Auckland


Lawrence Hatab’s book is a rewriting of a work that first appeared in 1978. Full of interesting insights and connexions, it is written in a style that is engagingly personal, confessional even: we learn, for instance, that the author is a long-term sufferer from ‘low grade, functional depression’ (p. 112).

Absolutely correctly, in my view, Hatab emphasises that Nietzsche is, first and foremost, an existential thinker: that his central concern is with the ‘meaning’ — that is, for Hatab, the ‘worthwhile[ness]’ (p. 20) — of life. What concerns Nietzsche is the problem of affirming a world ‘that ultimately blocks our natural interest in happiness [and] preservation’ (ibid.). This is the context in which Hatab announces that ‘my argument in this study … [is that] life affirmation and eternal recurrence represent the core and climax of Nietzsche’s thought’ (p. 106). (Slightly problematic, here, perhaps, is the fact that, whatever may have been the case in 1978, no one now, I think, would wish to contest this thesis.)

Chapter 1 presents Nietzsche’s problem — that of not allowing the death of God (and more generally of ‘being’) to plunge us into nihilism — and outlines his metaphysics. In place of the ‘being’ subscribed to by ‘the tradition’, Nietzsche postulates a world of pure ‘becoming’: ‘becoming’, however, that is not simply change but is permeated by the ‘agonistic’ structure of resistance and overcoming — the ‘will to power’.

Chapter 2 is devoted to The Birth of Tragedy. Hatab emphasises that a proper study of Nietzsche must always begin here, since the whole of his philosophy is a ‘variation or direct culmination of themes established in Nietzsche’s first published book’ (p. 23). What, above all, makes The Birth the essential starting point is the fact that the whole of Nietzsche’s philosophy is an attempt to recover the tragic, yet ecstatically life-affirming, vision expressed in Greek tragedy.

Though this seems to me absolutely right, I think Hatab exaggerates the continuity between early and later Nietzsche. As he says, the essence of the ‘metaphysical comfort’ provided by Greek tragedy is the ‘ecstatic self-transcendence’ (p. 25) of Dionysian consciousness. But what he obscures is the fact that in The Birth this is conceived in terms of Schopenhauer’s version of Kantian idealism; in terms of escaping the ‘dream’ of life to realise one’s identity with one’s ‘true’, transcendent self, the ‘primal unity’. Alluding to the famous ‘How the true World became a Fable’ in Twilight of the Idols, Hatab claims that, in The Birth, ‘the apparent world is not a fiction (the ’true’ world is)’ (p. 31). But this misses the fact that the story told in Twilight is, in part, a story of Nietzsche’s own overcoming of the idealism of his youth. The identification of the ‘apparent’ world as the one and only world comes at the end of Nietzsche’s story, not at its beginning. In The Birth itself Nietzsche is at one with the idealism — and pessimism — of Schopenhauer and of his patron, Richard Wagner. He is, as Zarathustra later confesses, one of the ‘afterworldly’.

Chapter 3 is devoted mainly to a précis of the Genealogy of Morals, a précis which contains the useful distinction between ‘life affirmation’ and ‘life enhancement’. (Slave morality possesses the latter characteristic but not the former.) It is, however, not particularly clear how this discussion is intended to fit into the overall structure of the book, nor why we have leapt from The Birth straight to the Genealogy. Sometimes one has the impression of the book as a loose assemblage of essays and lectures rather than an organically conceived whole.

Chapters 4, 5 and 6 form the centre of the book since these contain the discussion of eternal recurrence. Correctly, though these days relatively uncontroversially, Hatab emphasises the ‘existential’ interpretation of eternal recurrence. The ability to welcome the exact repetition of one’s life down to the very last detail is a test of one’s ability fully to ‘affirm life’ — and therefore, presumably, of one’s psychic health. In line with this, Hatab rejects the ‘cosmological’ interpretation — eternal recurrence as a scientific truth — the ‘symbolic’ interpretation — eternal recurrence as a mere metaphor — and the ‘imperative’ interpretation’ — eternal recurrence as a new kind of fundamental principle of action.

Hatab spends the whole of chapter 5 emphasising that though not to be taken as a ‘factual’ assertion, eternal recurrence is to be taken ‘literally’. This seems a somewhat laboured way of making what is, if I understand it, a relatively straightforward point. The point is that when the Gay Science‘s demon asks how one would feel about recurrence, in order to experience the full ’existential force’ of the test, one must ‘suspend disbelief’ and allow the thought to become one’s ‘virtual reality’ (p. 99). What is being said, I think, is just that one needs to take the test seriously in the way in which Method acting demands that the actor takes his part seriously. In the sense in which the Method actor ‘becomes Othello’, eternal recurrence must ‘become true’ for one for the duration of the test.

Chapter 7 is concerned to confront familiar objections to eternal recurrence as a test of one’s status as an ‘übermenschlich’ (150% healthy) type. Hatab spends much time — too much, I think — arguing that eternal recurrence excludes neither freedom nor creativity. Though there certainly are problems concerning the nature and possibility of freedom in Nietzsche’s philosophy, the bearing of eternal recurrence on the matter is relatively simple. All that needs to be said, I think, is that, if I perform a free action, then eternal recurrence entails — not that the action is unfree — but simply that that free action is one I have performed (freely) many times before.

The remaining objection Hatab considers is ‘moral repugnance’. Does not the test of eternal recurrence (and the injunction to amor fati which Hatab rightly regards as equivalent to it) require us to affirm — ecstatically to affirm — Auschwitz? I shall return to this central and difficult issue in a moment.

The final section of the book is an ‘Epilogue’ which argues, interestingly and convincingly, that the oft-despised part 4 of Thus Spoke Zarathustra ought to be understood as a humorous satyr play, placed where the Greeks would have placed such a play, after a trilogy of tragedies. The link between the humorous and tragic is that laughter, like tragedy, represents a Dionysian transcendence of the Apollonian conventions which govern life as an individual. The fact, however, that this discussion is only very tangentially related to eternal recurrence reignites the sense of the book as lacking organic unity.


Now I want to return to the objection that Nietzsche’s existential test requires us to affirm the ‘morally repugnant’ — and, is therefore, itself a ‘morally repugnant’ conception of psychic health.

Hatab thinks that Nietzsche is right: one ‘ought to measure up’ to ‘the existential test of eternal recurrence’ (p. 113) if one is to be a psychically healthy human being. But, as observed, if this requires one to give Auschwitz one’s unqualified blessing then the test must obviously be rejected.

Hatab, of course, agrees with this. By way of defending the test, he makes a useful distinction between ‘affirming’ everything, as the test (and amor fati) requires, and ‘approving’ everything. Nietzsche, he convincingly argues, does not require the latter – witness Zarathustra’s disdain of the ‘omnisatisfied’ and his honouring of ‘choosy tongues and stomachs’ which say ‘no’ as well as ‘yes’ (pp. 139-40). This focuses attention on the heart of the matter: how does Nietzsche think one can ‘affirm’, while yet ‘disapproving’ of, the horrendous?

The obvious line of explanation takes a leaf out of the Christians’ book and performs a kind of theodicy. On this approach, evil, no matter how horrible in itself, finds instrumental value and justification in its contribution to a greater good. What makes such a quasi-religious approach plausible is the Dionysian pantheism (I suspect Hatab would agree with this attribution) that appears, inter alia, in the repeated theme of the world’s ‘perfection’. In section 57 of the Antichrist, for example, ‘the most spiritual human beings’ affirm that ‘the world is perfect’. Moreover theodicy is what Nietzsche clearly performs in several places. Gay Science 278, for instance, says that to reach the ‘high point’ (of amor fati) we are to discover a ‘personal providence’ in our lives according to which ‘everything that befalls us’, even the loss of a friend or bodily injury, ‘continually turns out for the best’. And section 370 of the same work says that ‘the Dionysian god or man’ can allow himself ‘the sight of what is terrible and questionable but also the terrible deed’ since he has within him ‘an overflow in procreating, fertilizing forces capable of turning any desert into bountiful farmland’. Even, that is, if one cannot yet see the future good that justifies present evil, the ‘positive thinking’ which is a mark of Dionysian health makes one utterly confident that it will arrive.

Hatab, however, rejects this way of reading Nietzsche. What eternal recurrence is about is not theodicy (p. 139) but rather ‘affirm[ing] the eternal value of the temporal moment as such (p. 84). What it requires us to do, in other words, is to affirm each and every event regardless of any instrumental value it may or may not have. But now the question becomes acute: how could anyone affirm an event that one finds morally repulsive (or just repulsive) regardless of any relations in which it might stand to other events? Unless I have missed something, there is no very clear answer to this question in Hatab’s book.

In support of his anti-theodicy thesis Hatab quotes from The Will to Power (pp. 84-5):

My new path to a ‘Yes’. — Philosophy as I have hitherto understood and lived it is a voluntary quest for even the most detested … side of existence … . ‘How much truth can a spirit endure, how much truth does a spirit dare?’ — this became for me the real standard of value. Error is cowardice — every achievement of knowledge is a consequence of courage, of severity towards oneself, of cleanliness towards oneself — Such an experimental philosophy as I live anticipates experimentally even the possibility of the most fundamental nihilism; but this does not mean that it must halt at a negation, a No, a will to negation. It wants rather to cross over to the opposite of this — to a Dionysian affirmation of the world as it is, without subtraction, exception or selection – it wants the eternal circulation: — the same things, the same logic and illogic of entanglements. The highest state a philosopher can attain: to stand in a Dionysian relationship to existence — my formula for this is amor fati.

It is part of this state to perceive not merely the necessity of these sides of existence hitherto denied, but their desirability; and not their desirability merely in relation to the sides hitherto affirmed (perhaps as their complement or precondition), but for their own sake, as the more powerful, more fruitful, truer side of existence, it which its will finds clearer expression (Section 1041).

On the face of things, this indeed seems to support Hatab’s rejection of theodicy. But it also seems to demand that we value Auschwitz not as, say, the final lancing of the boil of anti-Semitism or the beginnings of the state of Israel, but that we find it ‘desirable’ in and of itself, and would so find it even if it had no positive instrumental value whatever. How one could do this, what it would be like to enter such a state of mind, seems to me utterly baffling. And, as I say, I find nothing in Hatab’s book to relieve the bafflement. So let me try to provide a reading of the passage other than that suggested by Hatab.

The note is, of course, obscure. But perhaps what Nietzsche is saying is something like the following. If every event has obvious instrumental value, if everything on the dark ‘side’ is the obvious ‘complement’ (necessary contrast) or ‘precondition’ of something on the bright ‘side’ of life, then life-affirmation presents no challenge. But heroic, ‘courageous’, ‘experimental’ spirits, the ‘stronger type of m[e]n’ (ibid.) who want to put their courage to the test, require, ‘desire’, such horrors in order to test and prove to themselves their own strength. As with Camus’ Sisyphus, the sense of one’s unblinking and unbroken courage in the face of the horror and terror of life — one’s refusal to commit suicide — is what is all-important in the ‘macho’ morality to which Nietzsche seems, here, to subscribe.

If this is the correct reading, then the bafflement disappears. For the reading, of course, does attribute instrumental value to Auschwitz, namely as a test for the strong to prove their strength. What the strong are affirming is something which has indeed no instrumental value with respect to any other event in the world. But it does have instrumental value with respect to the reflecting, philosophising subject for whom the world is a spectacle waiting to be ‘affirmed’ or ‘denied’.

So, if my reading is correct, there is, after all, a kind of theodicy being performed and the bafflement as to how one can ‘desire’ (in a sense) unredeemed evil is removed. But, of course, while no longer baffling, the ‘desiring’ of unredeemed evils so that the strong-minded can prove their strength is quite horrible — wicked. Nietzsche had, therefore, good reason for leaving this experimenting with a ‘new path to a ’Yes’’ unpublished. Had his wishes been carried out it would have been destroyed along with all his notebooks. As interpreters, therefore, we should consign the note to the oblivion Nietzsche desired for it and stick to the ‘old path’ of theodicy as his considered answer to the ‘problem of evil’.