Nietzsche's Naturalism: Philosophy and the Life Sciences in the Nineteenth Century

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Christian J. Emden, Nietzsche's Naturalism: Philosophy and the Life Sciences in the Nineteenth Century, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 254pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107059634.

Reviewed by Brian Leiter, University of Chicago


Christian J. Emden, an intellectual historian at Rice University, has written an informative if sometimes frustrating book about Nietzsche's engagement with both neo-Kantian philosophers (especially the "first-generation" neo-Kantians like Helmholtz and Lange who wanted to "naturalize" Kant [cf. 112-113, 149]) and the life sciences from the 1840s. Emden documents the preceding with an eye to shedding light not only on Nietzsche's naturalism, on "what does it mean to 'translate humanity back into nature'" as Nietzsche put it in Beyond Good and Evil (1), but also on what Emden calls "the problem of normativity" (1), variously stated as how to "obtain an understanding of the sources of normativity without appealing to normativity as a standard separate from the agency, affects, conceptual commitments, and also cells and organs, that make us natural beings" (1), or how to account for "the emergence of normative order" (15), or as the question "where does the binding force of such normative commitments ["the presumed moral authority of . . . truth"] originate?" (15). As these quotes suggest, the book is also philosophically ambitious, though not, I shall argue, generally successful in realizing those ambitions; confusions and unclarity about philosophical claims and concepts are often the source of frustration for the philosophically-minded reader. Despite that, the volume provides much useful material for such readers and is a helpful addition to the scholarly literature on Nietzsche's intellectual context and influences.

Before turning to some of the ambitious philosophical theses Emden advances, let me begin by noting four important points Emden's scholarship establishes which deserve particular notice.

First, Emden provides overwhelming evidence (complementing, e.g., Moore 2002) that Nietzsche had a deep and abiding interest in the nineteenth-century sciences and that he took himself to be extending scientific modes of understanding. No one who reads this book can doubt that Nietzsche is, in some sense, a philosophical naturalist, deeply influenced and inspired by the sciences of his day.

Second, Emden shows, convincingly to my mind, that "Nietzsche's position . . . is not anti-Darwinian, but . . . is highly critical of popular Darwinism, in particular its social and political conclusions" (43; cf. 163-164) and that his main objection was to "the strong teleological program that seemed to be part of the German reception of Darwin" as in Spencer and Haeckel (41; cf. 96). At the same time, Emden usefully notes that "it would be wrong to assume that, by the 1880s, all biological questions were answered by reference to natural selection and adaptation" (8), a fact of which Nietzsche was aware. Emden's discussion should, one hopes, put an end to the idea that Nietzsche was really an opponent of Darwin.

Third, Nietzsche was remarkably widely read in the nineteenth-century life sciences in particular. He was, for example, "an avid reader of the Textbook of Physiology by the Cambridge physiologist Michael Foster, published in German translation in 1881" (53) but also of such diverse figures and publications as the Jena physiologist William T. Preyer and the German zoologist Karl Semper (78), Georg Heinrich Schneider's 1880 "book on volition among animals" (138), the journal Kosmos, with articles "on heredity, on the reproductive cycles of algae and the evolution of sense organs as well as a long account of German Naturphilosophie and Lamarck as precursors to Darwin" (148), and the anatomist Wilhelm His's work on the development of embryos (189-190).

Fourth, while some writers have noted affinities between Hume and Nietzsche (cf. Leiter 2002: 4-5; Kail 2009), Emden shows this was not mere historical coincidence. Thanks to the now forgotten Maximilian Drossbach's "radically Humean account of causality," which Nietzsche read and which "has many marginal notes and underlinings throughout" (108 and n. 30), and the histories of philosophy by Kuno Fischer and Friedrich Ueberweg (which Nietzsche read carefully) in which "Hume represented the crucial step from early modern metaphysics to Kant's critical project" (109), it should be less surprising that Nietzsche's views, including about causality, have Humean echoes.

Emden's interesting historical details and erudition are enlisted on behalf of some strong philosophical and interpretive hypotheses, about which I have more reservations. The two central ones pertain first to the alleged grip of a certain neo-Kantian problematic on Nietzsche's mature corpus and second to Nietzsche's alleged interest in a particular problem of normativity. These interpretive claims both inform and are informed by Emden's treatment of Nietzsche's naturalism; we must first consider this treatment before turning to Emden's other interpretive hypotheses.

Naturalism, Method, and the Life Sciences

Emden says a variety of things about "naturalism," but I take it this early formulation comes closest to his central meaning:

Naturalism . . . at its very core . . . generally holds, first of all, that human beings are no special case vis-à-vis the rest of nature and, second, that the way we think philosophically about our position in the world should entertain a close relationship to the natural sciences broadly conceived (6; cf. 186).

This tracks fairly closely my distinction between Substantive Naturalism ("the (ontological) view that the only things that exist are natural," so, e.g., there are no supernatural entities [Leiter 2002:5]) and Methodological Naturalism ("philosophical inquiry . . . should be continuous with empirical inquiry in the sciences," though not only the "natural" sciences [Leiter 2002: 3]).[1] And indeed, Emden uses my distinction as the starting point (60 ff.) for Chapter 5, his most extended discussion of naturalism. But in that chapter, he makes two claims about naturalism that seem unmotivated, both textually and philosophically. First, he asserts that "substantive versions of naturalism . . . entail a kind of physicalist reductionism with regard to both the natural world and human cognition" (60); second, he asserts that methodological naturalism is committed to there being uniform scientific methods, yet "there [was] no unity of method among the nineteenth-century life sciences" (7), something Nietzsche understood on Emden's account.[2] Let us take these up in turn.

Emden claims that "naturalism, by its very definition, should tend toward physicalism" (62) and asserts that "the methodological naturalism Leiter ascribes to Nietzsche's mature philosophical thought also bears the traces of a more substantive variety of naturalism" (62-63). The first claim is obviously false except by stipulative "definition." Certainly some naturalists are physicalists, but if, as most naturalists do (and as I think Emden does), one treats methodological naturalism -- allegiance, in some sense, to the methods and results of the sciences -- as primary, then it is an open question what belongs in one's ontology, a question settled by whatever it is successful sciences need to do their explanatory and predictive work. Tyler Burge makes this point against reductionists quite effectively in his recent Origins of Objectivity:

Promoters of 'naturalizing' [i.e., substantive or physicalist] projects are often driven, I think, by misconceptions of science. These misconceptions breed misconceptions of mind. The notion of representation -- of reference or attribution that can be correct or incorrect and that helps type-individuate kinds of psychological states -- is entrenched not only in common-sense explanation but in scientific explanation in psychology. There is nothing unnatural or supernatural about such explanation. Some of the relevant psychology is well-supported, mathematically rigorous, mature science. There is no basis, even a prima facie one, to the worry that psychological notions are invitations to mystery or miracle. Even if there were such basis, the role that these notions play in powerful empirical science would undermine it. . . . I know of no good ground for thinking that. . . [psychologists'] explanatory claims must be twisted into the mold of biological or information-theoretic explanation, or any other explanation in the natural sciences, in order to be explanatorily successful. (2010: 296 -- 7)

That is the sound Quinean posture if we take successful science to be the arbiter of the real and the knowable[3] (and it should be distinguished from Quine's own dogmatic and un-Quinean commitment to physicalism and behaviorism long after the demise of both as successful research programs). But Nietzsche does not need to be a Quinean to clearly be on board with this point: his primary explanatory idiom is psychological, and his primary objection to German Materialism, for example, is that it tries to eliminate psychological idioms.

Even if methodological naturalism does not require physicalism, is Emden right that the version I ascribe to Nietzsche is "of the substantive ilk" (63)? His evidence for this assertion is puzzling. He points to work I have done with Joshua Knobe (Knobe and Leiter 2007) to argue that, as Emden glosses it, Nietzsche's "account of the emergence and function of moral norms . . . can be verified by the substantive results of cognitive science" (63). But showing that Nietzsche's naturalistic speculations about the nature of agency and moral motivation win support from recent work in cognitive science and behavioral genetics does not involve any commitment to physicalism or reductionism. That there are natural causal mechanisms that explain aspects of human thought and behavior does not commit a naturalist to physicalism or any other kind of reductionism.

Emden also complains that I attribute to Nietzsche a "methodological form of naturalism based on the assumption of a continuity of Nietzsche's philosophical project with the uniform methods of the natural sciences" (62, emphasis added), thus "operating with a fairly unreflected notion of what constitutes 'science' that implicitly stipulates a unity of method across all scientific disciplines" (63-64). In reality, I was quite explicit (Leiter 2002: 4 n. 7) that methodological naturalism

does not presuppose the methodological unity of the various sciences -- i.e., that all sciences employ the same methods -- only that successful sciences have some methodological uniqueness, i.e., there are distinctive scientific methods, even if those methods differ across the sciences.

Emden insists on the methodological plurality of the sciences -- which no one defending a naturalist reading of Nietzsche denies, as far as I know -- for two very particular reasons. One has to do with his interpretation of how Nietzsche thinks about causation, to which we will return in considering his reading of the Kantian strand in Nietzsche's thinking in the next section. The other has to do with his primary theme, namely, the alleged primacy of the contemporaneous life sciences, which were methodologically diverse, in Nietzsche's thought.

While Emden is convincing and interesting in documenting Nietzsche's engagement with the life sciences in the nineteenth century, he is rarely able to show concretely how they influenced Nietzsche philosophically except by reference to Nachlass notes -- the latter notable especially because Nietzsche chose not to publish them. Emden's two best, but rather modest, examples, from Nietzsche's published corpus concern (1)  first, the influence on Nietzsche's idea of genealogy of Schneider and Haeckel's idea that "Path-dependent development showed that evolution was not completely random, but, nevertheless remained marked by contingency" (138 ff.), and second, his repeated claim that "Nietzsche sought to situate his own philosophical project in close proximity to the discourse of animal morphology" (40), which he supports partly with Nachlass material but also, here and elsewhere (cf. 167), with section 23 of Beyond Good and Evil, which mentions "morphology." Emden glosses the latter passage as follows:

When Nietzsche . . . thus claimed that, "from now on psychology is again the path to the fundamental problems," what he had in mind was a "genuine physio-psychology," that is, a morphology of mental forms and intellectual configurations, which is always already linked to the material world since it is embedded in the body (40).

And he again adduces this same section of Beyond Good and Evil to argue against "a predominantly psychological reading of Nietzsche's naturalism" (50) since Nietzsche refers in passing to "physio-psychology" and since, according to Emden, "Biology . . . is more than merely a framework of the natural preconditions for human agency and moral psychology that are otherwise detached from biology" (50). Indeed, Emden declares that it is "a fatal mistake to read Nietzsche's emphasis on psychological phenomena -- such as moral feeling, will, and the self -- as proposing a conception of psychology without biology" (51). Why is it a "fatal" mistake? That is unclear since, of course, Nietzsche has no original contributions to make to biology, in contrast to his considerable power as a psychologist. This obvious point goes unnoticed by Emden, as does the fact that Chapter 1 of Beyond Good and Evil, of which section 23 is the concluding section, is devoted overwhelmingly to the deployment of psychological hypotheses about philosophers. Nietzsche clearly believed that physiology and biology were explanatorily important -- in this respect, Emden's is a useful, additional counterweight to the silly and now discredited "French" misreadings of Nietzsche -- but, equally clearly, he had absolutely nothing to contribute to speculative physiology and biology, whereas he was a psychologist of the first rank.[4]

Emden concludes his discussion of naturalism by raising two genuine points of interpretive dispute. First, how can Nietzsche's naturalism, on a rendering like mine, be reconciled with his alleged "neo-Kantian stance" (64) and his purported "epistemological and moral skepticism" (65)?[5] We shall turn to that issue momentarily. Second, Emden asks what are we to make of Nietzsche's doctrine of will to power on a naturalistic reading (65)? Here again Emden oversimplifies, claiming that my kind of naturalistic reading "discount[s] one of the central figures of thought" in Nietzsche, whereas I only argue against interpreting it as a metaphysical doctrine in favor of a psychological interpretation defended by many other interpreters.[6] Emden briefly notes the considerations raised in favor of the psychological readings of will to power by various interpreters (cf. 168-169) but never explains in Chapter 13 ("Living things and the will to power") why those considerations are not decisive. Instead, with heavy reliance onNachlass fragments and references to nineteenth-century "cell theory," Emden claims that to a considerable extent Nietzsche's "second-hand knowledge of cell theory shaped his attempt to see the will to power not merely as a metaphysical principle, but as grounded in biology" (177). No published text of Nietzsche's is cited in support of this extravagant claim. Indeed, the only published text he identifies as relevant in this chapter (at 169) is section 36 of Beyond Good and Evil, which Emden cites, remarkably, without even addressing Clark's incisive analysis twenty-five years ago showing that this putative argument for a metaphysical doctrine of will to power cannot be one Nietzsche actually accepts since it depends on premises he explicitly rejects (Clark 1990: 212-227).

The Neo-Kantian Problematic

The allegedly pervasive influence of Kant on Nietzsche, and especially neo-Kantians like Lange and Helmholz, is a central theme of Emden's account; Nietzsche, he claims, never gave up the "neo-Kantian framework" (25). What Emden has in mind is a question concerning "the relationship among mind, normativity, and nature" (24), exemplified by these remarks of Lange's:

(1) The world of sensory perception is a product of our organization. (2) Our visible (bodily) organs are, like all other parts of the world of apperances, merely images of an unknown object. (3) Our true organization is therefore as unknown to us as is external reality. In all cases, we are merely faced with the product of their interaction. (quoted in Emden, 24)

The relationship between mind and nature is certainly center stage in this passage, and there is one passage in the first chapter of Beyond Good and Evil (section 15) that seems to reflect an interest in this question; other textual evidence is a bit thin and, again, mostly confined to Nachlass material. Did Nietzsche have anything philosophically interesting to say about this issue? Emden does not, alas, make a case for an affirmative answer. This is symptomatic of his unhappy tendency to proclaim "bold" interpretations for which there is little evidence. Based on notebook entries about Kant and the problem of teleology in science from the 1860s, for example, Emden claims that, "No serious discussion of Nietzsche's philosophical naturalism is able to ignore these notes" (84) even though the topic is largely neglected in Nietzsche's published corpus -- except to repudiate teleology, as Emden ultimately acknowledges (100).

On certain aspects of the Kant/Nietzsche relationship as mediated through the neo-Kantians, Emden is quite good. In discussing Kant and Nietzsche on causation, Emden aptly observes that, "Nietzsche naturalizes whatever Kant regards as a priori, and the consequences of this move . . . bring him closer to Hume" (121), and he observes that for Nietzsche, "causality is neither a natural kind nor an a priori rule of the understanding" (119).[7] Both pithy summaries strike this reader of Nietzsche as accurate. Yet Emden also disputes that Nietzsche "retained a fairly strong, straightforward, and uncomplicated understanding of causation" (101), supposing, I guess, that a Humean understanding of causation is not sufficiently "strong, straightforward, and uncomplicated," though I am not sure why. Emden tries to associate "causation" with the discredited notion of "teleology," though the argument, if there is one, is opaque. Citing section 9 of the Third Essay of the Genealogy, Emden says Nietzsche is speaking derisively of "some alleged spider of purpose . . . which is lurking behind the great spider's web of causality" and thus was rejecting teleology by "casting doubt on a reified notion of causality" (103). But what Nietzsche actually says is that "our attitude towards God as some alleged spider of purpose and morality behind the great captious web of causality" is a case of modern hubris. Much doubt is cast on God and teleology here, none on causation.

The Problem of Normativity

The extent to which Emden's philosophical reach exceeds his grasp becomes particularly problematic in his attempt to grapple with what he calls the problem of normativity, which sometimes seems to be the problem of how any norms could be genuinely binding and sometimes seems to be only the banal problem of what naturalistic explanation we can give of human normative practices. Part of the difficulty is that Emden uses philosophical terms and concepts so loosely and idiosyncratically that it is sometimes impossible to follow what he is saying.[8] For example, he declares that "scientific realism . . . raises the question as to whether it remains reasonable, even possible, to distinguish between facts and values, between the world of nature and the intellectual world" (26). It is unclear what Emden means by "scientific realism" (it is certainly not what any philosopher in the last century or two has meant), and it is equally unclear how the fact/value distinction is supposed to be parallel to the natural/intellectual distinction. A bit later, he writes that, "Epistemic and moral claims, that is, the normative claims with which we tend to describe our actions and environment, can only become normative because they are, quite literally, embodied" (44). But normative claims, epistemic or moral, do not describe our actions or environment (they evaluate them, for example, by setting a standard by which either the correct description, or the action or belief described, should be assessed). The idea that such claims "become normative because they are, quite literally, embodied," is nonsense, obscured by the misuse of the word "literally." These are, alas, just two examples; my copy of the book is now annotated with several dozen big question marks in the margins next to similarly puzzling passages. The problem is particularly acute in Chapters 14 and 15, which are centrally concerned with normativity, but here is my best reconstruction of what Emden is trying to say.

All naturalistic readers of Nietzsche can agree that, "Nietzsche must be able to explain the emergence of normativity naturalistically" (66). Sometimes what Emden means is utterly banal, e.g., that we must "follow[] the historical development of . . . the values we hold" (186), a project Nietzsche is obviously engaged in. Emden's real thesis, however, is much more ambitious. He ultimately endorses the view defended by Katsafanas (2013) according to which "overcoming resistance is constitutive of all human agency" and thus power "gains normative force and emerges as a standard against which to measure whether our actions contribute to life" (182; cf. 200, 204). The descriptive claim on which this is based is preposterous on its face -- am I "overcoming resistance" when I answer the phone when it rings? -- but anyone interested in the prospects of such a view should read Katsafanas, not Emden. Emden goes on to explain that moral realists (of which Nietzsche is one, according to Emden!) believe that "moral properties supervene upon natural properties to which they can be reduced" (209-210), apparently not realizing that supervenience and reduction are competing metaphysical relationships and, ironically, committing Nietzsche to a kind of substantive naturalism about value after all! He goes on to conflate metaphysical and semantic questions in ways that philosophical readers will find confusing.

Scholars in other parts of the humanities sometimes dismiss "analytic" philosophy as irrelevant "logic-chopping," and they aren't wholly wrong: analytic philosophy is often guilty not simply of missing the forest for the trees, but of missing the trees for the twigs. If most contemporary work in analytic metaphysics and epistemology vanished from the face of the academy, almost nothing of any value or significance to the life of the mind, or humanity, would be lost. But one thing "boring" analytic philosophy does teach is how to think clearly, to draw distinctions, to understand your concepts and their entailments: perhaps alone among the liberal arts, it really teaches discursive reasoning and thinking. Other parts of the humanities are sometimes woefully deficient in these basic intellectual skills. The deficiencies of the work under consideration are illustrative examples. The impressive historical research and knowledge in this volume is easy to miss due to a morass of conceptual and dialectical confusions, which is a genuine shame.[9]


Burge, Tyler. 2010. Origins of Objectivity (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Clark, Maudemarie. 1990. Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

Kail, Peter. 2009. "Nietzsche and Hume: Naturalism and Explanation," Journal of Nietzsche Studies 37:5-22.

Katsafanas, Paul. 2013. Agency and the Foundations of Ethics: Nietzschean Constituvism (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Knobe, Joshua and Brian Leiter. 2007. "The Case for Nietzschean Moral Psychology," in B. Leiter and N. Sinhababu (eds.), Nietzsche and Morality (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Leiter, Brian. 2002. Nietzsche on Morality (London: Routledge). [A revised 2nd edition appeared in 2015, though the revisions do not affect the issues raised by Emden, who, for obvious reasons, cites the 2002 edition.]

--  -- -. 2015. "Normativity for Naturalists," Philosophical Issues: A Supplement to Nous 25 (forthcominig).

Moore, Gregory. 2002. Nietzsche, Biology, and Metaphor (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press).

[1] I discuss various permutations and nuances of these positions in Leiter (2002:3-6).

[2] Emden makes other claims in Chapter 5 that I find simply mysterious.  He says, for example, that substantive naturalism is "hard pressed to explain why scientific explanation about the world should be normatively binding in the first place" (60) without explaining why substantive naturalism has to explain any such thing.   Continuing in this vein, he says that for Quine, as for Nietzsche, "the appeal to the normative force of science is in many ways an appeal to conceptual contextualization, since any direct access to the things that surround us, if such access were remotely possible, would not tell us very much" (61).  It is true that both Quine and Nietzsche deny that perceptual evidence is ever theoretically unmediated, but what this has to do with the putative "normative force of science" is unclear.

[3] Sometimes Emden seems to be wondering why such an epistemic posture is itself normatively "binding," though I take it for naturalists it is not, a possibility Emden does not consider. Cf. Leiter (2015).

[4] Emden notes, interestingly, that Nietzsche had read the Danish philosopher Harald Høffding, for whom "psychology only made sense if it was able to look beyond mere introspection, drawing on physiology as much as on the new social sciences" (51).  Unnoted by Emden is that denying, as Nietzsche does, that psychology should be "a field of knowledge concerned with introspection or self-observation" (52) does not require that biology and physiology are the only alternatives—as the development of the cognitive sciences over the last fifty years makes clear.

[5] In the end, it turns out Emden thinks Nietzsche is a kind of moral realist, making this earlier claim a bit perplexing!

[6] Emden raises a third purported concern, claiming that I "exclude the creative and normative dimension of Nietzsche's genealogy—that is, the question as to how different, or new, normative commitments can be made to emerge" (65).  As support, Emden cites Leiter (2002:  11), which claims only that Nietzsche thinks genuine philosophers create values.

[7] Later he says that for Nietzsche "instead of the well-ordered universe of causal laws, there is something akin to a continuum of dynamic forces. Causal explanations merely refer to distinct events, or time periods, with which we seek to order this continuum to render life and knowledge possible" (161), which seems to me a "fairly straightforward" Humean way of thinking about causation.

[8] It is not only philosophical terms that Emden uses oddly.  He complains, for example, that "There is no coherent reason for arguing…that the…creative dimension of Nietzsche's philosophical thought falls outside naturalism" (200 n. 48) when what he means is that he does not accept the textual evidence and associated philosophical argument for this reading.  "Coherent" here seems to function emotively rather than as a cognitive term.

[9] My thanks to Jessica Berry for helpful comments on an earlier draft.