Nietzsche's Philosophy of History

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Anthony K. Jensen, Nietzsche's Philosophy of History, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 237pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107027329.

Reviewed by Andrew Huddleston, Exeter College, University of Oxford


With the exception perhaps of Hegel, no major philosopher before Nietzsche paid as much attention to history. In work after work, Nietzsche is concerned to show us that our concepts and practices have a history, and recounting that often surprising and uncomfortable history is part and parcel of his philosophical methodology. Yet as central as historical investigation is for Nietzsche, relatively little sustained work has been done on Nietzsche's philosophy of history -- that is, his views on what historians are up to and what standards of success there are for a given historical account. This is an important topic for exploration, and Anthony Jensen's contribution is a welcome one.

The scholarly erudition of Jensen's book is impressive. He displays a deep knowledge of Nietzsche's texts and notebooks and of the texts of many contemporaries of Nietzsche, some of whom have fallen into obscurity. Jensen does careful philological work in drawing on these in a usefully informative way, so that the reader learns a great deal about Nietzsche's intellectual milieu and influences. The sort of Quellenforschung that Jensen undertakes in various places in the book is far less common in Anglo-American Nietzsche scholarship than it is on the European continent, and it is cheering to see it making greater inroads, as an important supplement and alternative to the extraction and defense of philosophical doctrine from Nietzsche's texts.

The book progresses in chronological order, charting the changes that Nietzsche's views on history underwent. Jensen's first two chapters cover material from before Nietzsche's brief academic tenure as a philologist and his later flowering as an itinerant philosopher. Chapter 1 considers three efforts from Nietzsche's student years, namely his accounts of the Ostrogoth King Ermanarich, of Theognis, and of Diogenes. Nietzsche's concern is to set the record straight about these figures, filling in gaps in the historical record and explaining the production and corruption of their manuscripts (or of manuscripts about them). What we see in Nietzsche's early work are rumblings of his later genealogical methods, coupled with a penchant for the sort of historical speculation that would become considerably more pronounced in his published books. Chapter 2 focuses on influences in the air that were important in Nietzsche's intellectual formation. Jensen helpfully outlines two rival approaches to philology, Sprachphilologie and Sachphilologie, of which Nietzsche's teachers Friedrich Ritschl and Otto Jahn were respectively proponents. Their differences in outlook resist easy summary. But one difference is that whereas Sprachphilologie gave pride of place to the interpretation of texts, thus seeing language as the privileged window onto the past, Sachphilologie treated a wider range of artifacts (50). Particularly the former we see making a lasting mark on Nietzsche, even as he distances himself from various aspects of it.

Chapter 3 moves into more familiar territory, discussing the philosophy of history underlying Nietzsche's first book The Birth of Tragedy -- a text purporting, among other things, to give insight into the origins of Greek tragic drama. On Jensen's interpretation, there is an important change in methodology by the time of The Birth. Nietzsche forsakes the sprachphilologische methodology of his earlier academic work, and he comes to prefer instead a kind of quasi-Schopenhauerian "intuition" (Anschauung) that seeks to deliver a form of unmediated insight into the "eternal essence" (74) of a historical phenomenon, in this case, of tragedy.

Although Jensen is surely right that there is a certain method of painstaking philological scholarship that Nietzsche is eschewing in his first book, it is not clear to me that he has adequately characterized Nietzsche's alternative historical approach by means of this concept of intuition. One might first wonder: Does tragedy have an "eternal essence," according to Nietzsche? After all, the picture that Nietzsche is sketching seems to be one where tragedy arises at a particular time in history as the result of a confluence of various cultural forces. Moreover, to the extent that Nietzsche might endorse the possibility of a kind of intuitive insight into the "eternal" core of things (remarks to be interpreted gingerly, given his biting criticisms of Schopenhauer's epistemology and metaphysics in his notebooks of this period), any insight gained would seem to circumvent history (which of course transpires in time), not to be a useful mode of it. Jensen is cognizant of the philosophical shortcomings of the view he attributes to Nietzsche, and he is on solid ground in thinking that Nietzsche draws attention to the importance of "unmediated intuition" in the first sentence of The Birth. But Nietzsche is here saying that much will be gained for "the science of aesthetics" through the use of some form of intuition. He does not say that we will get at historical fact through intuition alone, nor, I believe, did he think he was doing so.

Chapter 4 focuses on one of the most fertile areas for understanding Nietzsche's views on history, the Untimely Meditations. Here Jensen convincingly corrects the mistaken idea that Nietzsche "hated" historians and history (106), a misinterpretation propounded by Hayden White and others. Nietzsche's complaints, as Jensen shows, are not with history per se, but with the way history is done and with the intellectual commitments and biases of various historians. Nietzsche laments the fact that in focusing on dry objective details, the historian can lose sight of why history is being studied, particularly its connection to Bildung and to life. Nietzsche also complains about 19th century historians that they interpret the events of history teleologically in such a way as to seek, in an unwarranted fashion, to justify the philistine culture of the present. As with some of the best of Nietzsche's work, Nietzsche's remarks on history here deftly blend psychology and sociology in the service of critical evaluation.

Chapters 5 and 6 are at the heart of the most ambitious part of Jensen's philosophical project, namely to argue that the mature Nietzsche embraces a form of "representational anti-realism" when it comes to history. (Then in his final chapter 7, Jensen extends a similar anti-realist picture to Ecce Homo and uses this model of history to understand autobiography as a form of self-history.) The anti-realism at issue does not deny that there are facts about the past. Rather, this anti-realism rejects the idea that historical accounts succeed as such in virtue of a kind of correspondence with that past. Although Jensen sees Nietzsche as rejecting realism of this form, he wants to chart a course so that Nietzsche does not end up falling into a kind of historical relativism, according to which any account of the past is as good as any other. The prime philosophical challenge is thus to articulate what this alternative view of historicity is and to offer the textual evidence that Nietzsche accepts such a view.

In seeking to develop a reconfigured notion of objectivity that moves away from correspondence, Jensen takes his interpretive inspiration from the famous passage in The Genealogy of Morality about perspectives and objectivity (GM, III:12). Yet the alternative notion of objectivity he attributes to Nietzsche proves rather unsatisfying. Jensen writes, in explication of the doctrine:

For Nietzsche . . . objectivity means the intersubjective agreement about judgments from within a specific type. Such a definition sacrifices any universal or non-subjective character of objectivity, true. It instead opts for a relational notion wherein the distortive character of the affective component of judgments is neutralized among those judges who share a similar set of affects. (127)

Jensen contends that the position just cited "is the meaning of [Nietzsche's] famous pronouncement about objectivity" (127) in GM III:12. Yet, so far as I can tell, nothing in this passage commits Nietzsche to denying the natural idea that the correctness of a proposition (historical or otherwise) is a matter of its correspondence with reality.

In addition to GM III:12, Jensen attributes to Nietzsche several further arguments against representational realism, not all of which I can discuss here. One is an argument from the uniqueness and complexity of the subject matter, anchored in Nietzsche's skeptical ideas in his early "Truth and Lies" essay. Reality, on this reading of Nietzsche, is too complex for any representation to capture it fully. "The designations provided by the historian are therefore symbols rather than correspondential references," Jensen writes (132). Yet even if this is Nietzsche's considered view in his later work (itself a questionable matter), the standard of capturing fully seems to set the bar too high on what correspondence would need to be. A map of a town that correctly shows the school to be north of the church doesn't need to represent all of the properties of these things in order to be accurate, in virtue of corresponding to the town's actual geography.

Furthermore, even if there is an inescapable subjective dimension to the representational scheme (for example, because using these particular symbols for the buildings is a matter of the human conventions present in that community), the map's accuracy is, at least in large part, a matter of whether those symbols correspond, in key respects, to how reality is. Why think that we don't have correspondence of a representation to an object unless we have full correspondence in every last property? Nietzsche of course held wildly skeptical views about a number of topics, and just because the view on offer is quite demanding, we shouldn't discount the possibility that it was Nietzsche's. Yet given its philosophical implausibility, and given the scholarship on how Nietzsche's ideas evolved after the "Truth and Lies" essay, I think the exegetical burden is really on Jensen to establish that this is a view that the mature Nietzsche also held, and I don't think he meets that burden convincingly.

Jensen's anti-realism is more attractive when it comes to causal and explanatory claims in history -- for example, that one phenomenon precipitated another. After all, it can be very puzzling whether this causality is an objective feature in the world, and if so, in what sense. Jensen is correct to think that Nietzsche denies that a certain overly simple mechanistic picture of causation can be used to explain historical causation and causation in general. But I thought Jensen then moved too quickly in claiming that, because Nietzsche is doubtful that there is causation of this form in the world, we must therefore be anti-realists about historical causation and think it is anchored in nothing more than intersubjective agreement among those who share a perspective. There is more space between alternatives than Jensen's implicit dichotomy allows. A more modest idea would be that there is a truth (or range of acceptable candidates for truth) about causal connections (or the lack thereof), independently of what a given person or community happens to believe about that topic. If a benighted community believes that their crops failed because they made inadequate obeisances to the gods, does Jensen's Nietzsche have any grounds to say, when their community historians record what happened that year and attribute it to the workings of the gods, that they are wrong? According to the community's perspective, their account is acceptable, and there is intersubjective agreement among them that it is. But aren't they just plain wrong, precisely because their account, in appealing to inert, fictive entities and non-existent causal connections, doesn't match up with reality?

While Jensen is right to think that Nietzsche is dubious of a kind of objectivity that would aspire to efface the contributions of subjects entirely, I worry that, in embracing anti-realism and rejecting correspondence, he is throwing out the baby with the bathwater. I think there is a serious danger here that Nietzsche is going to slip into the sort of relativism that Jensen is rightly at pains to have him avoid. At times, the view on offer from Jensen seems to boil down to a kind of subjectivistic conventionalism about objectivity, a matter of whether the account on offer strikes those who share a particular perspective as convincing (152). But in order to preserve any serious sense of objectivity, it would seem, the world itself needs to figure in the standard for accuracy of what we can say about it. If, for example, it turns out that the conceptual pair "good/bad" in fact did not precede "good/evil" as culturally salient, contrary to what Nietzsche claims in GM I, then his historical account is simply wrong, however much his narrative may resonate with his perspective and with that of those who share it. It would take much more to convince me that Nietzsche wants to deny this eminently intuitive idea when it comes to historical accounts.

I think Jensen is on the right track in thinking that Nietzsche, to the extent he has a worked out philosophy of history, sets himself against simple-minded conceptions of history as merely objective historical fact-gathering. One thinks of Nietzsche as treating with utter derision the flat-footed idea that there is one uniquely true account of some complex historical phenomenon. The multiplicity of interpretation is central for Nietzsche, and thus when it comes to recounting and explaining a given phenomenon, more than one story may well be acceptable. But that is compatible with thinking that a great many accounts are utter failures, because they don't track anything in reality. In short, I don't think that, simply in recognizing the necessity for an interpretive dimension and the potential for pluralism that follows from that, we should be tempted to deny realism and correspondence and embrace anti-realism. Yet whatever philosophical and exegetical doubts one may have about the particular account Jensen has developed, he has broached interesting questions on an under-explored topic in Nietzsche scholarship, and those who approach the topic later will need to grapple with his interpretation.