Nietzsche's Metaphilosophy: The Nature, Method, and Aims of Philosophy

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Paul S. Loeb and Matthew Meyer (eds.), Nietzsche's Metaphilosophy: The Nature, Method, and Aims of Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 284pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108422253.

Reviewed by Guy Elgat, School of the Art Institute of Chicago


The editors of this volume, Paul S. Loeb and Matthew Meyer, have gathered a number of exciting essays on the general topic of Nietzsche's metaphilosophy -- a topic which has not enjoyed such detailed and close treatment in Anglo-American scholarship as is provided here. The editors and the contributors are therefore to be thanked for their hard work.

The volume is divided into four parts. The first, "Evolving Metaphilosophies", puts special emphasis on Nietzsche's "free spirit" works and on how his views about philosophy changed across time. Meyer's excellent paper argues for the striking thesis (based on his book) that Nietzsche "constructs these [middle period, free spirit] texts to tell a story" (24) of the Aufhebung of traditional truth-seeking philosophy into the philosophy of the creative, artistic spirit in BGE, what signals a return to Nietzsche's original views in BT, PTAG, and the second UM. According to this interpretation, Nietzsche "does not write the free spirit works as a straightforward record of what he thinks at a given time" (24), but rather performatively enacts the will to truth's undermining of itself by its exposing of its own moral underpinnings. A problem with this is that only a handful of the middle period's aphorisms deal with morality's death at its own hands. That would make the majority of the free spirit writings redundant: it is not clear how they are supposed to fit in the "story" (32) Nietzsche allegedly tells. Relatedly, Nietzsche, when looking back on his writings, tends in many cases to continue adhering to his previously formulated ideas, and when he criticizes them, it is not so much their content which he finds objectionable but the medium (see, e.g. GM P 4). In addition, Meyer's claim that Nietzsche "consciously constructed" (32) this Bildungsroman sits uncomfortably with the EH (Clever, 9) reflections where Nietzsche says that the organizing idea of the thinker lies beneath the surface of consciousness.

Meyer further claims that in GS Nietzsche "develops a position that conflicts with Human", for in GS we have an attempt to "achieve some sort of reconciliation between philosophy and art" (30). But this issue has been on Nietzsche's mind already at the time of HH (e.g., HH 222). It is possible that this is a matter of change in priorities: while in HH art was supposed to be in service of truth and science, in his later thinking, as Marco Brusotti explains in his helpful contribution, the scholarly work of the sciences is seen as preparatory for the future artistic/creative philosopher.

Antoine Panaïoti's provocative paper, which in a way complements Meyer's, argues for a radical thesis according to which what he calls the "Analytical Nietzsche approach" (the scholarly approach to Nietzsche's writings that has become "dominant" in "contemporary English-language Nietzsche reception") is deeply misguided (42). Specifically, the Analytical Nietzsche is "metaphilosophically discontinuous with Nietzsche; it assumes the appropriateness of precisely that conception of philosophy that Nietzsche contests" (62). Moreover, the Analytical approach reinforces precisely the conception of philosophy that Nietzsche resisted and thus transforms Nietzsche "into an enemy of the future he envisioned" (ibid.) Nietzsche's metaphilosophy is radically different from the Analytic view, Panaïoti claims, in that the former, in contrast to the latter, emphasizes the axiological, legislative, intuitive, inspiration-based, personal, and creative (59-60).

This is an exciting criticism, but one which I cannot fully share (due perhaps to professional bias). First, the metaphilosophy ascribed here to Nietzsche is mostly based on either his early writings or on his remarks in BGE regarding the philosophers of the future where indeed the philosopher is seen as an intuitive, creative spirit. In other words, it almost completely discounts Nietzsche's own practice as a philosopher in the free spirit writings and even later in the Genealogy and Twilight, for example. Second, and perhaps more importantly, Panaïoti describes Analytic Nietzsche's metaphilosophy as the view that philosophy "ought at least to be 'continuous' with the social and natural sciences in its methods and its findings. Philosophy, on this account, ought to follow the sciences' lead" (60).[1] But Nietzsche himself emphatically identifies with the methods of science (AC 13, 59; TI, Reason, 3). Moreover, as mentioned, Brusotti argues that Nietzsche also thinks that the philosophers of the future should base their acts of value creation on the basis of the results of the various sciences (GM I 17 Note), and to that extent their legislations should be "continuous" with the sciences' findings. Of course, "Analytic" interpretations of Nietzsche are not done in the same style or rhetorical register that Nietzsche employs in his texts, nor are they typically interested in such features of his writings, but this does not in itself entail that they operate with a radically different conception of what the aim (or an aim) of philosophy is (e.g., a more naturalistic moral psychology and ethics). Nevertheless, I think it is true that "Analytic" scholars of Nietzsche would not count as philosophers of the future in Nietzsche's eyes.

The second part of the volume, "The Nature of Philosophy", opens with an informative essay by Rebecca Bamford in which she explores his "free spirit" works and highlights ways in which Nietzsche understands the interrelations of philosophy and science. In this way, Bamford's essay could also serve to balance Panaïoti's view.

Loeb's rich contribution offers a detailed exegesis of BGE 211 in which Nietzsche provides the most explicit characterization in his late period of the 'genuine' philosophers of the future, the central trait of which is that they unleash their will to power by creating values. Loeb analyzes the differences between the genuine philosopher and the "priestly" and "laborer" philosopher. A central question he addresses is how to think about Nietzsche himself: should we view him as a genuine philosopher or as a mere laborer and as such merely concerned with surveying, analyzing and abbreviating past value creations? Loeb argues that for the most part Nietzsche remained a laborer, with the exception that he also served as a kind of prophet of the genuine philosopher of the future. But this in my view does not emphasize enough how the very act of heralding the future philosophers is a legislative, creative act. Drawing on his work on Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Loeb also provocatively argues that Nietzsche himself did not create new values but left that job to the "character" Zarathustra. This is a peculiar claim which assumes that a sharp and clear line could be drawn between Nietzsche's own views and those of his philosophical creation.

Robert B. Pippin's dense contribution interrogates Nietzsche's perplexing claims regarding the significance of the mask so as to better grasp Nietzsche's conception of philosophy and religion in BGE. Pippin focuses on an apparent tension in Nietzsche's treatment of religion: on the one hand, in BGE 61 Nietzsche claims religion is beneficial, but in BGE 62 criticizes it for turning humanity into a "sublime monstrosity". How to resolve this tension? Pippin claims, without expounding, that while these views are logically compatible, "it is baffling to think through concretely how this could be anything other than a mere logical possibility" (120). I fail to see the problem here, but find Pippin's suggested Straussian solution to the tension intriguing: Nietzsche's disparaging of religion is a mask employed to produce "such a thorough alienation of the conventionally religious that they will dismiss the Nietzschean critique, and so their religion can continue to play whatever positive role Nietzsche really wants it to play" (122).

The third part, "The Method of Philosophy", begins with Mark Alfano's essay. Alfano delectably focuses not so much on Nietzsche's view about what philosophy is or should be in general, but about Nietzsche's conception of his own philosophical practice which involves, Alfano argues, expressing one's own perspective and engaging the feeling and values of one's readers so as to shift their perspectives insofar as this has epistemological payoff. A question arises as to whether (and how) the adept perspective-shifter can integrate the views seen from previous perspectives or whether he or she is just "stuck" at any given point in time in the perspective currently occupied. The former must be possible if perspective-shifting is not to be epistemically pointless (for some discussion see Elgat 2017, pp. 146-7).

Tsarina Doyle discusses Nietzsche's will to power naturalism and how this approach promises to explain values and norms in a manner which does away with the familiar dualism of reasons and causes. Doyle's discussion, unfortunately, reads like a condensed summary of earlier work and is thus very difficult to follow and so properly assess its riches.

Paul Katsafanas' entry on Nietzsche's moral "methodology" is exquisite and is in my mind one of the best short introductory pieces to Nietzsche's critique of moral philosophy, summarizing some of the main ideas of Katsafanas' earlier work. However, much like Doyle's paper, it does not really focus on Nietzsche's metaphilosophy, strictly speaking, and seems a bit out of place in the collection.

The fourth and last part is "The Aims of Philosophy". In the first essay João Constâncio zooms in on GS 373 and intriguingly suggests that Nietzsche operates with an aesthetic conception of philosophy grounded centrally in the concept of taste. He argues that "good taste" (GS 373) for Nietzsche is very much Kantian in that like the latter's reflective judgment of taste it involves a plurality of perspectives and yet does not advance us towards knowledge "even one tiny bit" (202). This contrasts sharply with Alfano's view with which I side: after all, towards the end of GS 373 Nietzsche claims that the mechanistic perspective would have "conceptually grasped, understood, recognized [begriffen, verstanden, erkannt]" (GS 373, my translation) nothing of music, which implies that a different or broader perspective would have been more successful with respect to these cognitive goals.

Beatrix Himmelmann compares Nietzsche to Heidegger in terms of their rejection of metaphysics and in terms of their conceptions of finitude, ethics and politics, with a focus on Nietzsche's immanent philosophy of the will to power, which she favorably contrasts to Heidegger's quasi-transcendental fixation with Being. Though the paper proclaims to discuss "Nietzsche's metaphilosophy" (207), this is not exactly carried out. Himmelmann claims that for Nietzsche everything is will to power, and wills to power are what they are only in relation to other centers of power. This could potentially imply a conception of philosophy as itself a kind of force that operates at the level of specific interventions the meaning of which is to be interpreted contextually.

Oddly enough, the collection does not explore in detail Nietzsche's meta-philosophical claim that philosophy has been nothing but a kind of personal, moral confession (BGE 6). Scott Jenkins' thought-provoking paper can be seen as addressing this lacuna insofar as it focuses on Nietzsche's claims (Jenkins focuses on a Nachlass note) that traditional metaphysics is a product of metaphysicians' ressentiment. In brief, the idea is that traditional metaphysicians suffer from the world of appearance and, driven by ressentiment, take revenge upon it by means of inventing another metaphysical reality that is valued by them as better or higher. Jenkins helpfully examines the ways this idea resembles the ressentiment­-motivated slave revolt, and explains that "By imagining the perishing of all things as an act of punishment, and endorsing that punishment, the metaphysician partially satisfies his ressentiment toward the world" (235). Yet who is the punishing agency in the case of metaphysicians such as, say, Kant or Schopenhauer? And is imagining the perishing of the world by some "cataclysmic event" (235) really part of traditional metaphysics? Furthermore, Jenkins ties ressentiment's revenge too closely to the possibility of making the target of one's revenge suffer (233). The world of appearance, however, cannot suffer. Jenkins claims that the world can nevertheless be destroyed (235), but this obviously does not address the problem. Here, the tendency of ressentiment to imagine its target as liable to suffering might be of help (see GM III 15 and Elgat 2017, p. 31).

Jacqueline Scott's paper ends the volume and attempts to draw from Nietzsche's "tragic philosophy" (247) lessons that could be applied to our "racialized lives" (248) and the "profession of philosophy" (262). Scott understands Nietzsche's tragic philosophy to address the "problem of decadence": "we must create values to hold off suicidal despair, but any values we create will decay" (250). To better conceptualize the tragic philosopher she draws heavily on GS 382 where Nietzsche puts forward the ideal of a "spirit who plays naively -- that is, not deliberately but from overflowing power and abundance -- with all that was hitherto called holy, good . . ." (GS 382). But how is this to apply to the problem of racism? Scott's suggestions to adopt Nietzsche's tragic philosophy, experiment with our racial identities, and reverse values (262), while intriguing, remain vague. What does it mean to address racism "not deliberately", but "naively?" Should we be naïve about how we experiment with our racial identities? Can we afford to? What would it mean, in this case, to reverse our values and "play" with "all that was hitherto called holy, good"? Wouldn't that entail reversing our valuation of racial equality and justice? Should, perhaps, only racists become Nietzschean, adopt Nietzsche's tragic philosophy, and reverse what they think is "good"? Scott obviously does not call for such revaluations, but this only shows how applying Nietzsche's radical ideas to a liberal, egalitarian agenda might be more than problematic.

All in all, this is a valuable collection of essays that scholars interested in the topic should find useful in orienting their thinking on this issue.


AC      The Anti-Christ, in The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, Twilight of the Idols, And Other Writings, J. Norman, trans., Cambridge University Press, 2005.

BGE    Beyond Good and Evil, W. Kaufmann, trans., Vintage, 1966.

BT       Birth of Tragedy, S. Ronald, trans., Cambridge University Press, 1999.

EH       Ecce Homo, W. Kaufmann, trans., Vintage, 1967.

GM     On the Genealogy of Morals, W. Kaufmann and R.J. Hollingdale, trans., Vintage, 1967.

GS       Gay Science, W. Kaufmann, trans., Vintage, 1974.

HH      Human all too Human, R. Hollingdale, trans., Cambridge University Press, 1986.

PTAG Philosophy in the Tragic Age of the Greeks, M. Cowan, trans., Gateway 1962.

TI        Twilight of the Idols, in The Anti-Christ, Ecce Homo, Twilight of the Idols, And Other Writings, J. Norman, trans., Cambridge University Press, 2005.

UM     Untimely Meditations, R. Hollingdale, trans., Cambridge University Press, 1997.

Z          Thus Spoke Zarathustra, W. Kaufmann, trans., The Modern Library, 1995.

Elgat, Guy, Nietzsche's Psychology of Ressentiment: Revenge and Justice in On the Genealogy of Morals, London: Routledge, 2017.

[1] To be precise, this metaphilosophy is ascribed to 'mainstream' analytic philosophy, but I take the implication to be that this is also Analytic Nietzsche's metaphilosophy.