Non-Being: New Essays on the Metaphysics of Non-existence

Non Being New Essays On The Metaphysics Of Non Existence

Sara Bernstein and Tyron Goldschmidt (eds.), Non-Being: New Essays on the Metaphysics of Non-existence, Oxford University Press, 2021, 331pp., ISBN 9780198846222.

Reviewed by Zach Weber, University of Otago


Taking non-being seriously has, until recently, been considered by many to be dabbling in the dark arts. It seems obvious that things like the present king of France, or present cure for cancer, don’t exist, don’t have being, and so can be said to have some kind of non-being—they are things that aren’t. But sentences like “There are things that don’t exist” are notoriously tricky. Russell’s 1905 theory of definite descriptions suggested a way to avoid empty names, and by 1948 Quine was mocking advocates of non-being as “those philosophers who have united in ruining the good old word ‘exist’”. Consensus formed: non-being is non-sense. Case closed.

Of course, the case has never really been closed and all along there have been cogent advocates of taking non-being seriously. Now we have a collection of essays that announces a new era in the area—new, that is, by skipping the twentieth century debate about it almost entirely. Perhaps the most striking thing about this collection is how casually it treats its own right to exist (sorry). The editors Sara Bernstein and Tyler Goldschmidt open by asserting almost as a truism that, along with existing tables and chairs, “we are surrounded by things that don’t exist” (xi), and that while non-existence might be mysterious, that is a good reason to investigate it; the essays collected here implicitly suggest that no apology is needed. Meinong himself barely rates a mention, and the pugilistic neo-Meinongian Richard Routley/Sylvan is not cited at all. This book argues, by omission, that we are in a post-Meinong-versus-Russell/Quine world. This is a welcome shift.

The 17 essays collected here are extremely varied. This is to be expected, since once one gets beyond arguing for the right to study non-being, the range of available topics—all the things that aren’t—is almost unlimited. There are contributions about metaphysics, ethics, philosophy of science, philosophy of language, and more, approached from analytic, continental, Buddhist, and Jewish philosophical perspectives. The introduction to the volume is short and does not purport to unify or tie together the entries, beyond breaking down the chapters into rough groupings and saying that “the essays bear on each other in ways not captured by their order” (xiii). So it is left to the reader, mostly, to get their own bearings. The editors have curated a very impressive collection, and they let the work speak for itself.

It isn’t possible or sensible to give a critical review of each chapter, so I will chunk the 17 chapters into a few groups and make some comments along the way. Broadly, chapters progress from abstract metaphysics to applied topics in language, ethics, and death. There are three different chapters with titles that are variations on the phrase “something out of nothing”.

The lead essay by co-editor Bernstein (Chapter 1) lays out the idea of ontological pluralism about non-being: just as there may be different modes of being, there are different ways not to be. Non-being has structure, and this idea has “promising explanatory power for a range of theological, metaphysical, and phenomenological explananda” (14), especially if we can follow some other realist trends in metaphysics and find that non-being can be ‘carved at the joints’, so to speak. Non-being pluralism can open new options in several debates. For example, in philosophy of time, a presentist can hold that even though the past and future do not exist, they don’t exist in different ways, and that helps account for our phenomenal experience of yesterday versus tomorrow. For another example, non-being pluralism allows a distinction between types of non-events: some events are close to happening but do not, and so seem to have some causal influence (like a virus not killing a politician) while some events aren’t even close to happening (like Napoleon running for political office in 2022). Or for a third example, non-being pluralism can help explain how a fictional character’s non-existence is different from the non-existence of the evenest odd number. This is fertile ground and Bernstein mostly is content to open it up; the position is exploratory, aiming to show not that pluralism is true, but that it is worth further discussion. This plants a flag for the papers to follow, even if they don’t all fall under the framework Bernstein sets out.

Following Bernstein’s chapter, the first few essays concern some “fundamental” questions. In Chapter 2, “Nothingness and the ground of reality”, Graham Priest proposes that there is an entity called ‘nothing’, written in bold as nothing, and it can coherently be thought of as the background of the world: that against which all other objects “stand out”. What lies behind reality? Nothing, of course, and that is a something-that-is-also-not-something. Priest suggests that this paradoxical idea is discernible in the (very difficult) works of Heidegger and the (even more difficult) work of Nishida. Priest reconstructs the ideas with admirable clarity. Some of this will be familiar to readers of Priest’s other writing, and those wishing for more logical reassurance will need to check, e.g., Priest’s book One (2014) for (paraconsistent) details, as many questions are left unanswered. For example, according to Priest, nothing has no properties, because it is not an object (also it is); but then one might ask why it also does not have every property. Why? One might reason like so. If nothing has no properties, then it does not have the property not-F, for arbitrary F. But then, it does have the property of not-not-F, the property of not being not-F. By double negation, nothing is F. Since F could be anything at all, that result seems like it might be bad. (Nothing has the property that 1+1=3, so 1+1=3?) Priest can answer this, I think, but he does not do so here.

Perhaps the strangest chapter is Roy Sorensen’s Chapter 3, “Thales’ Riddle of the Night”, which asks (and answers) the esoteric question: which came first, night or day? Readers of Sorensen’s work on shadows like Seeing Dark Things (2007) or Roberto Casati’s The Shadow Club (2003) will find themselves in some familiar territory—though this excursion becomes borderline hallucinogenic in utterances like: “The eerie truth is the Night, as the shadow of Earth, is the oldest thing on Earth” (34). Sorensen offers broad scholarship and also at least one inexplicable wingding (a picture of a drum after the words “drum-shaped” on p.48).

Fatema Amijee in Chapter 4 “Something from Nothing” argues that some negative existential facts are not only true but fundamental, in the contemporary sense of fundamentality from the grounding literature. In particular, “totality facts” that list off all the things that do exist also need a clause saying “and those are all the things—there are no other things”. So totality facts can require negative existentials. This chapter explicitly tries to rebut arguments against non-being, and in doing so makes a solid case for further consideration of negative existentials as serious contenders for fundamentality.

The next set of essays are about ‘sparse’ ontologies, theories that say that nothing, or almost nothing, exists. In Chapter 5, Filippo Casati and Naoya Fujikawa argue against Markus Gabriel’s claim that the world does not exist. (Gabriel is a recent figure in efforts in so-called continental philosophy to restore a robust sense of realism.) The authors use non-standard mereology that allows infinite chains of proper parts, to argue against Gabriel.

In Chapter 6 Koji Tanaka takes up some questions from Buddhism, such as how to make sense of the doctrine that there is no self. Tanaka assumes that Buddhist philosophers hold that there are no facts of any sort, and then considers how such a “global error theorist” can purport to prove that non-existent things do not exist. His conclusion leaves Buddhists with some unresolved difficulties.

In Chapter 7, Bryan Frances outlines a theory called plurality pointillism, where reality boils down to “dots” that are real, but things composed of them (like trees) are ultimately not. There are no trees, or anything else that is properly composed of pluralities of tiny fundamental bits. This position bears some close affinities with both composition-as-identity and mereological nihilism, which Frances notes, though I would have profited from reading more about how this chapter’s novel proposal differs from and improves upon those.

In Chapter 8 “The Cosmic Void” Eddy Keming Chen takes a more physics-based approach and asks us to reconsider some of our most basic assumptions, like whether a fundamental material ontology is really required for any (successful) physical theory. If not, the challenge is to explain (or “save”) the appearances that there are fundamental material objects, and here there are connections to work in ontological nihilism.

The next two chapters call to mind Alexander’s dictum (that to be is to have causal powers), by considering cases where negative entities can have real effects. In Chapter 9 Casati and Achille Varzi revisit the 2000 US Presidential election recount which hinged on answering whether or not a ballot had a hole. Holes, of course, are ontologically problematic entities par excellence (“A hole is where something isn’t” (159)) as the authors have detailed at book length in 1994 following a prompt from Lewis and Lewis, and this chapter is a diverting reminder of that pleasantly perplexing other work.

Then in Chapter 10 Aaron Segal raises the “gobsmackingly spooky” idea that something might come from nothing—or at least, nothing actual. This involves the (very non-Lewisian) idea of causation between possible worlds, which Segal goes through and makes plausible, after specifying various precisifications of the kind of “spookiness” he is after. The lively chapter wraps around to theological speculations drawn from Jewish mysticism: Kabbalists who put forward the “riddle wrapped in a mystery” that identifies God with Nothing, and this again with the Infinite or ein sof. Segal argues that the Kabbalists were not proposing sheer nonsense, and contra Parmenides there is a way something might have come from nothing.

Goldschmidt (the volume’s co-editor) and Sam Lebens’ Chapter 11 looks to modal metaphysics for a reason there cannot have been nothing. Here they canvass a range of options from the literature on modal metaphysics—realism, combinatorialism, ersatzism, dispositionalism—and find that these all motivate anti-nihilism: it is a necessary truth that there is something rather than nothing, and perhaps that even explains why there is. Whether this really provides a satisfying response to one of philosophy’s oldest questions (Lewis thought not), it is significant enough to establish consensus between such different approaches to modality.

Continuing with issues in modality, in Chapter 12 Craig Warmke asks whether there are possible but non-actual things (possibilism) or not (actualism), following Parfit. Warmke argues that even actualists—a position he says “has approached the status of philosophical orthodoxy” (205)—need to quantify over mere possibilia. But they can do so by denying that quantifiers carry ontological commitment: following noneism (attributed to Priest, though the position goes back to Routley/Sylvan), the ‘backwards E’ quantifier is “particular” rather than “existential”. So actualists can quantify over non-existent possibilia without a problem—at least, to the extent that noneism is without problems.

Shifting into philosophy of language, and perhaps answering a question that has occurred to the reader, Chapter 13 “Saying Nothing and Thinking Nothing” by Lorraine Juliano-Keller and John Keller consider the issue of deceptively interesting nonsense. Some nonsense gives at least the illusion of meaning. How can that be, if ultimately it is impossible to think meaningfully nonsensical thoughts? The Keller’s sketch a defense of “empty” thoughts allowing that we can and do think about nothing, and even know what we are thinking; “we just don’t always know what, if anything we are thinking about” (247).

In Chapter 14 Arif Ahmed notes that we can think and care about things that don’t have any place at all in actuality, and so while such counterfactual thoughts are not about anything, they are still important. What makes Ahmed’s treatment particularly distinctive is attention to feelings of regret about things that might have been, and how these have real-world implications when we calculate risk.

The final sequence of essays follows out these more normative questions. In Chapter 15 Jacob Ross looks at ways we might do harm by non-doing. There is a standard moral distinction between actions and omissions, but Ross finds problems with this and proposes instead what he calls an explanatory relevance view, which focuses more on motivations and personal character.

Chapter 16 by Carolina Sartorio picks up the same thread, and circles back to the metaphysics of omissions: who is to blame in some famous overdetermination cases. Sartorio helpfully distinguishes cases where the metaphysics has moral bearing from cases where it does not; she says that the more uncertain our responsibility judgments are, the more the metaphysics matters.

Finally in Chapter 17 we reach the ultimate non-being, death. “Death’s Shadow Lightened” by Daniel Rubio defends the old Epicurean idea that death is not a harm (because when we are alive death is not a problem for us, and when we are dead it is not a problem for us either). This discussion leads into some deep mortal questions about the value of life, and whether deprivation of life is a kind of harm. The chapter sets out different kinds of value (extrinsic instrumental, extrinsic final, intrinsic instrumental, and intrinsic final) and searches for a harm associated with death under each, finding none. I must admit here that while Rubio has a light touch, I am left with a familiar cold feeling that follows any attempt to “explain away” existential concern. The philosopher carefully lays out why something that has seemed to many to be perhaps the biggest problem—the ultimate absurdity that scuttles all our projects—and explains why we are mistaken. Something appealing about the spirit of this whole volume is that non-being is so much a part of our lives that it must be taken seriously, not dispelled. However insightful Epicurus may be, his view seems not in this spirit. Maybe death’s shadow is lightened, but as Sorensen intoned earlier, shadows are ancient and enduring.

This collection is more than the sum of its parts: as a whole, it shows how ignoring conservative orthodoxy about existence immediately reveals fruitful directions across many areas and approaches to philosophy. In a topic that could easily become fixated on technical issues, it is admirably accessible. Non-being is at the center of concerns in everyday life, from the night, to voting, to forgetting to call your mother. We regret and celebrate things that do not happen (a lost friendship, an accident avoided), and the philosophers here take that at face value. The book is recommended as a refreshing invitation to some wide and deep original philosophy that leaves the last century’s conservative consensus fading into non-being.


Quine, W.V.O. (1948), “On what there is,” in From a Logical Point of View, Harvard University Press.

Richard Routley, Exploring Meinong’s Jungle and Beyond (1980), new edition as The Sylvan Jungle volumes 1–4, Eckert, Hyde, et al (eds), Synthese Library, Springer, 2018–20.