Notes Toward a Performative Theory of Assembly

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Judith Butler, Notes Toward a Performative Theory of Assembly, Harvard University Press, 2015, 248pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967755.

Reviewed by Christoph Menke, Goethe University Frankfurt


One of the most remarkable and astonishing phenomena of the last years is the return of politics to the streets and squares of the big cities. The Occupy Movements (in New York and Hong Kong), Tahrir Square, Puerta del Sol, Gezi Park are just some of the names that stand for a phenomenon that can be observed all over the world. It has been met with as much enthusiasm as critique; the first attitude praises it as “a powerful and surging multitude, one that in itself constitutes a radical democratic event or action” (182), while the second claims that “their acts are only symbolic”, not being able to change anything about the existing, indeed increasing, economic and social inequality (181). While the enthusiasm is ignited by the belief in the emergence of a new political subject whose power is able to challenge the institutionalized forms of politics from outside, the critique is fueled by the skeptical insight that this is a power which dissolves without a trace, as quickly as it has emerged — a power without any efficacy (and hence no power at all).

There is probably no one among those who share an emancipatory interest, an interest in the liberating transformation of society, who has not been torn between these two antipodal reactions. But this only shows that neither of them can be true. From Judith Butler’s new book we can learn why: by asking for the aims and effects of the new forms of political practice, one fails to see how they operate, indeed what and how they are. The reflection thus has to start by thinking “about what it means to assemble in a crowd” (71). We then see that the fundamental feature of the new forms of political practice is that “bodies in their plurality lay claim to the public” (71). Political practice is here a bodily enactment for which it is essential to be plural — an enactment of or by a plurality of bodies, the public assembly of bodies.

Butler’s analysis of this basic structure draws on two main theoretical sources. The one is Hannah Arendt’s reconceptualization of the political as the “space of appearance”, which Butler repeatedly discusses. The essential idea which Butler takes over from Arendt is to ground the political in the public, and to understand the public as “the ‘between’” that brings its element into being (77). Quoting Arendt, Butler writes that “the ‘true’ space then lies ‘between the people’” (73), so that the space of appearance does not exist by itself, as pregiven, but is brought about by the very act of appearing itself. But as Butler shows in her next step, Arendt misses the true nature of the public act of appearing — the sense in which appearing is an “act” — by inscribing it in “the distinction between the public and private domains”. The consequence is that Arendt “forgets or refuses that action is always supported and that it is invariably bodily” (73). For the bodily existence is in Arendt’s theory relegated to the private sphere (and thus the business of women). According to Butler however it is constitutive to the political — and this is precisely what is to be learnt from a reflection on its new, contemporary forms — that it is itself a bodily enactment.

Here the other source of Butler’s reflections becomes relevant. It is the theory of gender which she has developed in earlier writings (cf. 26 sqq.). As Butler shows, the structure of gender is instructive for the analysis of public assemblies because they share a fundamental feature: both gender and assemblies are performative and in both cases performativity is essentially marked by the fact that it is a bodily performance. Public assemblies are performative by enacting, at the same time realizing and showing or presenting, the specific “being-with” that defines us in our bodily existence. The public assembly makes what is; it is or exists only in its (self-)making. This is the general definition of performativity; it means that being is becoming or making. The decisive insight of Butler’s analysis of gender performativity — which she brings to bear here on the understanding of public “appearance” — is that this connection between being and making also has to be read in reverse. If (contrary to Arendt) the public appearance also has a bodily nature, then its performativity cannot be reduced to that of a subjective, self-conscious act. The performativity of, or by, body assemblies is rather constitutively passive. For the body, as matter, is precisely the medium or instance of “dependence”; in their existence, as their self-preservation, bodies are dependent on “conditions”: on other bodies, human and non-human, but also on resources in general, of physical, psychic, cultural, etc. character (88-9). The assembly of bodies is thus a performance which is as passive as it is active. It entails “both the processes of being acted on and the conditions and possibilities for acting.” (63) To think about the bodily performativity of public assemblies in the light of gender theory leads to nothing less than a revision of the very concept of political action.

But in what sense — one is tempted to ask with Arendt — can such an assembly be called genuinely “political”? What is political about the common appearing of a plurality of bodies, even if this appearing has a performative character: not just being a plurality of bodies, but showing, exposing or even ‘asserting’ it (16)? Up till now we have only reconstructed what Butler at one point calls the “theatrical self-constitution” of the public space of appearance (85). But what then is the relation between the theatrical and the political? Is the theatrical the political?1  Or what is the process by which theatrical performativity becomes political?

We can derive Butler’s answer to this question from the way in which she proceeds. As indicated, the basis, the beginning and fundament, of her reflections is a (phenomenological) description which explores the — performative or theatrical — mode of being of the new kind of political practices. She then takes a further step in which she goes beyond such a phenomenology and offers a theoretical explanation of the phenomenon in view. There are two such theoretical approaches in her book: the first one is the social theory of neoliberal capitalism, the second a political theory of radical democracy. In both contexts, the task of “theory” is to answer the question of why the public assembly of bodies has become a central phenomenon of contemporary politics — while in the first, phenomenological approach the question of how it is enacted stood at the center. The decisive point however is that these two perspectives or levels cannot be kept separate. For it is impossible to establish the genuinely political character of the public assembly of bodies in a merely internal, phenomenological perspective. The public assembly of bodies only becomes political by being theorized.  I will try to explain this claim, which I see implicit in Butler’s way of proceeding, with reference to the first of the two theoretical contextualizations which she is offering, namely by inscribing the practice of public body assemblies in a theory of contemporary society.2

In the perspective of social theory Butler reads the new forms of manifestation as an answer to the neoliberal transformation, or radicalization, of capitalism during the last three or two decades. This capitalistic regime is distinguished from the former, liberal or social-democratic one by making each individual itself responsible for the production and re-production of its socially and economically productive form, as labor force. This has been described as leading to a condition in which the individual is permanently confronted with an excess of demands which it never can satisfy (which in turn gives rise to depression). While this is the situation of those who are still (somehow) in the game, Butler is much more interested in its other or outer side: namely the production of “precarity” as the condition of those who, for subjective or objective reasons, are not regarded anymore as embodying the required labor force and appear as “disposable”. “Precarity” is thus defined as “that politically induced condition in which certain populations suffer from failing social and economic networks of support more than others, and become differentially exposed to injury, violence, and death.” (33)

Such a theory of the neoliberal production of precarity allows for an interpretation of the new practice of bodily assemblies that goes beyond the phenomenology of their theatrical performativity. Already considered in itself, this practice can be described as realizing an ethical value or possessing an inherent goodness: the goodness of gathering, of being together in mutual perception, interaction and recognition. But this ethical goodness acquires an entirely different meaning when it is considered in relation to the neoliberal social condition. Butler describes this relation as critical response and resistance. This explains why the practice of public assemblies of bodies has become relevant or even urgent now, under neoliberal conditions. For if precarity means the politically produced absence, or even destruction, of the conditions of livable life, and if these conditions are essentially bodily, referring to bodily existence, then the public assembly of bodies can be read as enacting and asserting, as asserting by enacting, a social counter-practice of the body. In the context of a theory of neoliberalism one can see that the assemblies of bodies stand in a polemical relation of opposition to the prevailing social conditions of domination. Thereby the genuinely political character of the public assemblies of bodies, beyond and above their ethical value, becomes visible. We can now speak, as Butler does, about these assemblies as practices of “solidarity” or “equality” (66) which realize a “right to appear” by those who are deprived of public visibility in the neoliberal regime (27, 81). The emergence of the political character of the assembly of bodies thus depends on an act of theoretical reflection or contextualization: on a critical reading that goes beyond the merely internal phenomenology of their theatrical performativity.

But this immediately raises the question of who relates the assembly of bodies to the present social conditions. How, when and by whom is the critical reading of the assembly of bodies in the context of the present social condition done? A superficial answer would be: by the social theorist, in this case Butler herself, in her book. But then the question is how this theoretical work of reading and explanation is related to the practices on which it reflects. Butler describes these practices in such a way that they appear as being already (proto)theoretical in themselves. She writes: “When the bodies of those deemed ‘disposable’ or ‘ungrievable’ assemble in public view  . . . , they are saying, ‘we have not slipped quietly into the shadows of public life: we have not become the glaring absence that structures your public life.’” (151) The public assembly is thus not only or just “a performative enactment of bodies” (177). Rather, the public assembly of bodies speaks. It speaks about itself: it situates itself in the context of, and in response to, the neoliberal production of precarity. In thus speaking, the assembly of bodies goes beyond its mere (“theatrical”) performativity and becomes theoretical (or self-reflective): it explains itself to itself by relating itself to its other.

To summarize the decisive point of this argument, we can say that the theatrical performativity of the public assembly of bodies needs theory in order to become political. And “theory” here means “displacement, comparison, a certain distance. To theorize, one leaves home.”3 Theory is the activity of reflecting on oneself, and to reflect means to compare oneself with and to relate oneself to one’s other. Such a reflection is by no means just an intellectual requirement. It is a political requirement — the requirement of the political. For what separates the public assembly of bodies as a solidary, egalitarian practice from the reactionary self-celebration of a group identity which Butler describes with the example of Tea Party crowds and their “joyous forms of cruelty” (13)? If every “sphere of appearance” is necessarily limited (77-8) it needs the constant effort of transcending the particularity of its identity: by linking this specific assembly of bodies with those other ones, at other places, by other groups (58). No assembly of bodies is political in itself. It only becomes political by connecting with other assemblies. And in order to do this, not only media are needed (cf. 92) but also concepts. Precarity is not just an empirical condition; it is the theoretical representation, and interpretation and explanation, of an experience. With the help of such concepts each of the particular assemblies of bodies can describe itself as fighting against the same social conditions and thereby linking itself to other assemblies of bodies.

This leads back to the question of form: which form does a collectivity have to have in order to be political? In light of Butler’s analysis, this question seems to require a double answer. One answer is that it needs to be a public assembly of bodies; it needs to be theatrical in order to be true to the bodily conditions of action, or being, whose vulnerable and fragile nature is highlighted by the neoliberal politics of precarity. The other answer is that it needs to be more than an assembly of bodies, even more than a series of assemblies; it needs to be an assembly of assemblies. Such an assembly of assemblies comes into being by acts of “saying” (Butler) in which an assembly — theoretically — explains itself and — politically — links itself to other assemblies and other struggles. Who or how is the subject that is capable of such saying? It cannot be the assembly in its theatrical mode of performativity. The assembly has to transform itself into a different political subject. One traditional name for this other mode of political subjectivity was “party”. It seems that also the politics of the public assemblies of bodies sooner or later is facing one of the oldest and unresolved questions of radical politics. It is the question of organization.

1 For a detailed exploration of this question see Juliane Rebentisch, The Art of Freedom: On the Dialectics of Democratic Existence, Polity Press 2016.

2 Butler unfolds the other theoretical context, the theory of (radical) democracy, especially in chap. 5: “‘We the People’ — Thoughts on Freedom of Assembly”.