Objectivity and the Rule of Law

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Mathew H. Kramer, Objectivity and the Rule of Law, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 247pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521670104.

Reviewed by Veronica Rodriguez-Blanco, University of Birmingham


The Rule of Law is often conceived as an ideal or a moral aspiration that guides the actions of officials and citizens within a legal system. Its precise nature is at the centre of important recent inquiries in legal philosophy. Associated with these inquiries are questions about the objectivity of law and the Rule of Law, and the relationship between the two. In his new book, Matthew Kramer aims to disentangle the relationship between the different kinds of objectivity and the Rule of Law and looks at the impact of the former on the latter. The book is divided into three sections. In the first section, Kramer is at pains to distinguish between the different possible conceptions of objectivity and to describe the interrelationships between these conceptions. The second part of the book argues that there is a distinction between the rule of law as a merely juridical phenomenon and the Rule of Law as a morally constructed phenomenon. The final section aims to answer the question of whether issues surrounding the objectivity of law have any relevance to the nature of the moral authority of law, and implicitly therefore, to the Rule of Law as a moral construct.

In his analysis of the different conceptions of objectivity, Kramer follows the standard route of distinguishing between ontological, epistemic and semantic objectivity and concentrates mainly on the first two. He discusses at length the idea that ontological objectivity involves mind-independence which, he tells us, can be understood as existential or observational mind-independence.  Existential mind-independence is weak when the 'occurrence or continued existence of something is not dependent on the mental activity of any particular individual' (6) and it is strong if the occurrence or continued existence of something does not depend on the mental activity of any individual or group of individuals. Similarly, observational mind-independence is weak if 'the nature of something is not dependent on what it is taken to be by any particular individual' (6) whereas it is strong if the nature of something does not depend on what it is taken to be by members of any group individually or collectively.

Kramer asserts that most general legal norms are existentially weak mind-independent, which means that there must be mental activity by a group of individuals for legal norms to exist. In other words, if a particular individual believes that there is a rule whose content is 'one ought to kill children at midnight' and the individual believes that this is a legal norm, then the mental activity, i.e., the belief of the individual, does not make this private or individual rule a legal norm. This is hardly controversial and therefore trivially true. It is well-recognised among legal philosophers of all traditions that one of the key features of law is its social character. Furthermore, legal norms, as opposed to moral norms, guide the conduct of a group of individuals, namely participants of a legal community. Distinctions such as these both illuminate and enable us to disentangle elements that, at first sight, are not often clearly demarcated.  But, if a scholarly distinction is to serve an explanatory and illuminating purpose, each of the two sides should be reasonably advocated by one or more scholars. However, Kramer's distinction between weak and strong existential mind-independence plays no role insofar as strong existential mind-independence in law is absurd and has no defenders. Kramer points out:

the existential mind-independence of such norms is weak rather than strong. They cannot persist in the absence of all minds and mental activity. They abide as legal norms only so long as certain people (most notably, judges and other legal officials) collectively maintain certain attitudes and beliefs concerning them. (7)

To think otherwise is to imagine that there can be laws that no one could obey, or recognise, or imagine, not even a supreme being such as God.

Why Kramer introduces this distinction is puzzling. Consider, however, that Kramer also argues that law is observationally mind-independent, which means that the nature of law does not depend on what individuals take, or a group of individuals takes, it to be (6). He asserts that both observational and existential mind-independence are ontological categories. It is intriguing how something, from the ontological point of view, can depend for its existence on the mind of collective individuals and at the same time its nature does not depend on what the collective takes it to be. To illuminate the issue, let us investigate how the rules of etiquette might stand on this debate. Their existence and nature depend on our mental activities. Thus, the content of the rules of etiquette such as that "In England I ought to eat with knife and fork whereas in China I ought to eat with chopsticks", depends on what is taken to be a 'rule of etiquette at the table' in either England or China respectively. But Kramer tells us that this is not the case for law. The content of a legal norm such as 'drivers should not drive above 80 miles per hour on the motorway' depends for its existence on the collective of individuals (judges and other legal officials), but its nature does not depend on what the collective, namely judges and other legal officials, take it to be.

The question than arises:  what does the nature of legal norms depend on?  Perhaps Kramer aims to advance a 'two worlds' ontology: in one world there are legal norms whose nature is independent of what we take it to be, in another world, our world, the collective mental activities of judges and officials pick out features of the first world and make possible their existence and occurrence in our world. But it is not clear that this is Kramer's intention. Furthermore, this is a less than illuminating ontology for law. He discusses another conception of objectivity as ontological, namely objectivity qua determinate correctness. This involves the view that 'legal norms ordain the legal consequences of people's conduct' (15). Kramer argues that the indeterminacy of law has been exaggerated and confused with other issues such as uncertainty and indemonstrability. The latter involves the view that 'correctness cannot be demonstrated to the satisfaction of virtually every reasonable person who reflects carefully on the matter' (17).

Kramer points out that uncertainty is an epistemic state, which means that beliefs are inadequate, whereas indeterminacy is an ontological state. However, he does not explain what indeterminacy as an ontological view involves. Moreover, he asserts,

we are well advised to conclude -- pace Dworkin -- that any functional systems of law, including systems that have taken on board the correct principles of morality among their norms, will be confronted by situations that occasion legal questions to which there are no determinately correct answers. (36)

Is Kramer here confusing epistemic and ontological indeterminacy? Or rather, does he mean, in the light of his previous discussion, that from the ontological point of view, the nature of legal norms in all legal systems is both strongly mind-independent and indeterminate, according to the circumstances? More arguments are needed to support this view. In later paragraphs, he asserts that legal concepts are vague, but he does not clarify how they are vague and this argumentative deficit is crucial to understanding the indeterminacy thesis qua ontology that he advocates. There are three different theories of vagueness, namely epistemic, metaphysical and linguistic. Authors such as Timothy Williamson (Vagueness, Routledge, 1994) argue that reality is epistemically vague. Thus, a concept such as 'bold' is epistemically vague because we are ignorant of the sharp boundaries that distinguish between 'bold' and 'not-bold'. By contrast, some authors such as Trenton Merricks ('Varieties of Vagueness', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 2001: 145-157) advance the idea of metaphysical vagueness. According to this idea, 'x' is metaphysically vague if for some object and some property there is no determinate fact establishing that that object exemplifies that property. Other authors such as Sorensen (Blindspots, Oxford UP, 1988) have argued that vagueness is a phenomenon of our language, i.e., there is no settled fact of the matter about whether a vague word describes a certain object. Nevertheless making the language more precise can eliminate vagueness. Kramer would need to advocate metaphysical vagueness to preserve the coherence of his claims about the ontological indeterminacy of law. However, as already pointed out, Kramer has also claimed that law is existentially weak mind-independent; in other words, he claims that legal norms cannot exist unless they are part of the mental activity of officials and judges. Furthermore, he defends the view that law is objectively and epistemically robust, namely 'convergence (at least among experts) is typical, and serious disaccord is exceptional' (49). But if this is the case, it would be sensible and coherent for Kramer to advocate linguistic vagueness rather than ontological indeterminacy and vagueness. He could assert that we are able to sharpen the boundaries of our legal words since the occurrence and existence of legal norms depend on the legal participants. Thus, the determinacy of legal norms through language can be dependent on the legal participants.

In the second part of his book, Kramer discusses the distinction between the Rule of Law and the rule of law. According to Kramer, the latter is morally neutral in the sense that it could serve opposite goals, coordinating people's activities on the one hand and on the other hand allowing 'government's effective perpetration of large-scale projects of evil over lengthy periods' (102). He discusses the eight precepts that make law possible as advanced by Lon Fuller in The Morality of Law (Yale UP, 1969) and subsequently goes on to provide reasons that support the view that these eight precepts are morally desirable. According to Kramer, if we analyse the desirability of the rule of law from the moral point of view, then we transform the juristic phenomenon into a moral-political phenomenon and consequently the rule of law becomes the Rule of Law as a moral aspiration. He argues that the rule of law is a necessary condition for the Rule of Law. In other words, we cannot assess the morally desirable features of the rule of law unless we first have the juristic phenomenon, namely the rule of law.

Nigel Simmonds has famously objected to Kramer's view ('Straightforwardly False: The Collapse of Kramer's positivism', Cambridge Law Journal 63, 2004: 98-131; Law as Moral Idea, Oxford UP, 2007) arguing that for Fuller law is intrinsically a moral idea or archetype and therefore one cannot separate the 'juristic' and the 'moral' features of the Rule of Law. Simmonds argues that a legal system, like a triangle or a circle and their ideal forms, approximates its ideal or archetype to a greater or lesser extent. In this section, Kramer objects that Simmonds confuses the 'mathematical' or abstract notion of 'circles' or 'triangles' with the material conception. According to Kramer, 'a circle defined mathematically is a purely abstract entity rather than something that can genuinely be instantiated in the material world' (106). He continues: 'Material entities are not purely abstract entities to any degree. There is a difference of kind, rather than merely a difference of degree, between a circle in the strict mathematical sense and a circle in the everyday sense' (106). Kramer argues that Fuller's eight precepts cannot be an archetype as Simmonds suggests because if that were the case, the precepts would be specifying conditions that are different in kind from those that obtain when any actual legal system exists (106). For Kramer circularity in the everyday sense is a non-scalar property. This means that it obtains in an all-or-nothing fashion. Similarly, Kramer argues that an actual legal system is either a legal regime or not and therefore that being an actual legal system is a non-scalar property. What is the ontological conception that Kramer is defending? He claims that there can be an ideal form, but that participation in this ideal form is different in kind and therefore participating is not a matter of having a scalar property.

We know, however, that Simmonds' view about universals correspond to a Platonist view in the philosophy of mathematics. Numbers, circles and triangles are universals and everyday circles, triangles and numbers participate to a lesser or greater degree in the ideal form. Kramer advances no arguments that would ground his rejection of Platonism for universals. If Kramer's point is that abstract objects play no role in the causation of our beliefs, he has advanced no arguments that would ground this point. Furthermore, Kramer misses the point of Simmonds' idea on archetypes and therefore his criticism becomes misdirected.  Simmonds would agree with the view that once a legal system passes the threshold (to use Kramer's terminology), then it becomes a legal system. In Simmonds' terminology, the legal system participates in the ideal form. However, this participation can be defective if the legal system is, to some extent, not sufficiently close to the ideal. What is contested is not the identity per se of a legal system, but rather the way in which legal systems can be defective in relation to the ideal. Of course, in order to be classified as a defective legal system, it needs to be a legal system first and Simmonds does not deny this. However, for Simmonds, identity is defined in terms of participation in the ideal form. Furthermore, Kramer's skepticism about the idea of a reality that by 'degrees' approximates to an ideal is in tension with his own views on strong observational mind-independence and indeterminacy as ontological.

The final section of the book aims to determine the relationships between the different distinctions on objectivity and law's moral authority. According to Kramer, strong observational mind-dependence is destructive of the moral authority of law. This means that the set of beliefs of individuals will determine what the law is and this will yield arbitrariness, indeterminacy and so on. Consequently, one can infer that strong observational mind-independence is required to preserve the moral authority of law (205-6, 210-216). However, Kramer also tells us that

no legal system can ever be present without that mind-independence, and given that the existence of a legal system is necessary for the existence of a heinous legal system, the strong observational mind-independence of legal norms is necessary for the heinousness of a system of law. Any legal system in the absence of such mind-independence is impossible, and thus any evil legal system in the absence of such mind-independence is impossible.  (p.190)

How can we reconcile these conflicting claims? The first claim is that observational strong mind-independence and its consequential determinacy ensure, at least partly, the moral authority of law. (One might need to assume that this independent reality involves some moral elements so that it is able to perform the task of preserving moral authority.) The second claim is that observational strong mind-independence constitutes a condition for evil legal systems.

One way to reconcile the two claims might be by asserting that in order to identify the evil or the goodness of legal regimes, one needs an independent reality that enables us to realise that there is moral error and therefore evil. This independent reality also enables us to get it morally right. So far so good. However, a closer inspection of these statements will show that the tension cannot be so easily dissolved. Let us recall that Kramer distinguishes between the Rule of Law and the rule of law. The latter, a juristic phenomenon, is a condition for the former, the moral construction of the Rule of Law. The rule of law as a juristic phenomenon, according to Kramer, can fulfill Fuller's eight precepts and be simultaneously evil. Arguably, the origin of the evil might be that a group of individuals determine what is right or wrong or that such decisions can be arbitrary and, consequently, undermine the moral authority of law. Nevertheless, according to Kramer, we might still have a legal regime because the constitutive condition of law, observationally (strong) mind-independence, is fulfilled. But this possible scenario clearly contradicts the first claim, namely that observationally strong mind-independence and its consequential determinacy ensures the moral authority of law. In other words, according to Kramer, in order to have an evil regime, we need observational strong mind-independence. However, this mind-independence condition also involves the view that the nature of law cannot be dependent on what it is taken to be by individuals or groups of individuals. Therefore, evil law is not true law, where evil is produced by what a group of individuals believe. Similarly, a rule of law is not truly a rule of law in cases where the content is dependent on what a group of individuals believe. The same applies for legal systems. There would be both false and true cases of legal systems. Evil legal systems that fulfill Fuller's eight precepts, and in which the content of their laws depends on what a group of individuals considers to be law, will be most likely false legal systems and therefore not legal systems at all.

Kramer's examination of the relationship between the objectivity of law and the Rule of Law has inconsistencies that cannot be easily dissolved. This is regrettable since the topic is of great importance and significance. The puzzling features that hinge on the relationship between objectivity and the Rule of Law will need to wait for a more illuminating diagnosis and solution.