Obstacles to Divine Revelation: God and the Reorientation of Human Reason

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Rolfe King, Obstacles to Divine Revelation: God and the Reorientation of Human Reason, Continuum, 2008, x+281pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781847062581.

Reviewed by John Bishop, The University of Auckland



The theist traditions hold that God reveals himself to historically and culturally situated finite minds. But how is this possible, and what can hinder such revelation? The notion that God’s ability to reveal himself may be limited is familiar enough. In his first chapter Rolfe King provides illustrations from Calvin, Kant, Barth, C.S. Lewis, and Richard Swinburne, concluding with Christ’s remark in the farewell discourses in the Gospel of John: ‘I still have many things to say to you, but you cannot bear them now’ (John 16:12). What is original is King’s taking obstacles to divine revelation as the focal issue through which to view much discussed issues in the epistemology of religious belief. Conducting the inquiry from this fresh perspective proves both stimulating and fruitful: philosophers of religion — and epistemologists generally — will profit from engaging with King’s work.

King argues that there are obstacles to divine revelation in the sense of ‘feature[s] having to do with the created order that may either block or hinder a form of divine disclosure, or [have] in some way to be overcome for God to disclose himself’ (133). These features constitute ‘a necessary structure of revelation’ that places logical limits on God’s revelatory options (56).

What are these features? King suggests two principles for identifying them. First, he observes that our epistemic problems with religious belief must ‘also work in the other direction’, so that ‘every epistemic problem about particular forms of evidence, or potential evidence, for God, is an obstacle to revelation’ — this is ‘the epistemic-revelatory principle’ (39). Second, he argues that divine revelation could be intelligible and credible to created minds only within a suitable context which requires divine providence: ‘All revelation requires a potential revelatory context, and there is a whole group of obstacles to revelation related to the process of setting up such a context’ — this is ‘the revelatory-context principle’ (40). For God’s revelation to be recognised, background knowledge and skills of discernment will be required; their acquisition will take time, with a ‘maximum revelatory content’ for any one episode and, accordingly, a ‘maximum pace’ for revelation. By reflecting on his ‘Eden parable’ — concerning how God might provide evidence of his existence and loving nature to Adam and Eve before the Fall — King concludes that, setting aside the theological commonplace that the chief obstacle to divine revelation is the fallen will, God still faces obstacles in disclosing himself (44-7). If Adam and Eve are to know him as God, King thinks, some kind of verbal communication will be required (whether through an inner voice or an external messenger). So, to give special revelation, God must self-testify. In this case,

God is effectively asking [Adam and Eve] to trust him that he is truthful and that his intentions towards them are good, albeit that there seems no way they could check his intentions independently of his testimony … [T]his … involves a decision to trust, over and above the evidence, that this person is God (57).

These considerations uncover the key epistemic problem about divine self-disclosure. For revelation to succeed, created minds must, individually or collectively, have experiences that they are able correctly to interpret as revealing God’s presence, character and will (or some aspects of these). But any experience that might play such a role threatens to be ambiguous — open to equally coherent alternative non-revelatory interpretations (‘naturalist’ ones, in particular). This threat of epistemic circularity may, arguably, also affect the claims to general revelation made in natural theology. In any case, as King observes, theists will assume that ‘whatever may be learnt of God, aside from his special revelation, falls far short of what God desires us to know’ (17). King’s study thus emphasises special revelation, which King thinks can succeed although God’s options for achieving it are significantly constrained. Short of eschatological revelation, King claims, God cannot make a decisive ‘major revelation’ of himself in human experience — an inability arising from the limitations of created minds and the salvific purposes God chooses to pursue. Instead, God’s ‘best revelatory plan’ is a programme of ‘discreet revelation’ that involves patiently setting up a context in which revelation may be received by selected persons who then convey it to others in a progressive reorientation towards ‘human ideal rationality’. In this process, incarnation features as an especially useful tool. (See Chapter 7 [123-39], and, on incarnation, 148-50.)

These conclusions throw interesting light on the atheist argument from divine hiddenness. Theistic defences against this argument tend to assume that God could reveal himself, but may have good reasons for remaining hidden (e.g., to preserve human freedom); indeed, J.L. Schellenberg explicitly maintains that God could put his existence beyond reasonable doubt by giving us a sense of his loving presence. King’s investigation of obstacles to divine revelation suggests, however, that this claim is dubious, and that the argument from divine hiddenness may best be resisted by arguing that God is logically unable to reveal himself unambiguously (see Chapter 9 [154-71]).

But surely God would be able to reveal himself by placing theistic beliefs in finite minds directly, without supplying any evidence? Beliefs about God may indeed be ‘properly basic’, as the Reformed epistemologists maintain, but King argues that such direct cognition is ‘only possible if sufficient evidence is in place to justify reliance on the relevant practices’. God’s presence can be basically evident only if

this type of experience has been correctly identified in the first place as being of God … Everything therefore comes down to the divine self-testimony about these experiences. Is there sufficient evidence to trust that it is God who was involved at the outset? (100, author’s emphasis)

King here uncovers a limitation in Reformed epistemology: while theistic doxastic practices in which beliefs about God are acceptable as basic are indeed well established, they are not entirely on a par with sensory perceptual doxastic practices, since the question of overall commitment to the former is a live option whereas there is nothing optional about practical commitment to the latter.

King thus concludes that all (special) revelation depends on trust in God’s self-testimony, so that the right epistemology for revelation is the epistemology of testimony. He makes the interesting suggestion (Section 6.5 [118-21]) that all epistemology reduces to the epistemology of testimony — though one might wonder whether treating questions about trusting our cognitive and perceptual capacities as equivalent to questions about trusting the testimony of witnesses places too much theoretical weight on an apt metaphor. King’s claim that a putative special revelation could be accepted only given trust that it is indeed God who speaks seems well founded, however. Such trust might, of course, be implicit. But reflective theistic believers must recognise that they are venturing (perhaps hitherto implicitly) in this way, and — if they are to continue to regard their commitment as justified — must obviously regard such venturing as justifiable, at least under certain conditions.

How may this trust be justified? Is there a way to avoid the apparent epistemic circularity, whereby anyone inclined to doubt that a given experience is revelatory will also be inclined not to trust the putative divine self-testimony it entails? King characterises his stance as an evidentialist one — albeit as ‘trust-evidentialism’ (176). He thinks that, to be justified, believers require sufficient evidence to trust that it is God who speaks. Can God provide sufficient evidence? King thinks there are fifteen types of possible divine self-testimony (ranging from giving a sense of presence or visions of glory to acts of power such as resurrection — for the full list see p. 174). But would any of these, individually or in combination, count as sufficient?

An important distinction needs to be made in answering this question — and I will make it in the context of King’s emphasising that his testimony-based epistemology for revelation is also a ‘journey-epistemology’ (Section 11.2 [200-5]). Theistic commitment is commitment to a journey in which, potentially, an initial venture of trust that it is God who speaks is reinforced as the experience of living out that trust progresses. So we must distinguish between the evidential basis for continuing commitment during the journey, and the evidential basis for the initial commitment to begin the journey at all. Actually, there is a deeper distinction, between evidence that is sufficient relative to an established practice of accepting revelatory evidence, and evidence sufficient for commitment from an external, neutral, non-committed, position. That distinction is deeper, since a committed theist well advanced on the journey, and satisfied, relative to the established practice of her tradition, that she has adequate evidence, may on reflection acknowledge that very evidence as insufficient to compel rational assent from a neutral standpoint. From such a standpoint, theistic commitment may require venturing beyond the evidence, not just at the outset, but throughout the journey of faith.

So it may seem reasonable to interpret King’s trust-evidentialism as requiring only that there be sufficient evidence for trusting God’s self-testimony relative to an established theistic doxastic practice: in other words, as requiring that the continuing journey be rationally supported by confirming evidence. For, as already noted, King remarks that initial commitment to accepting divine revelation would have to be ‘over and above the evidence’ (57). His ‘trust-evidentialism’ might thus seem to recommend trusting in order to find evidence that, if it is indeed there, would not otherwise be accessible. On this interpretation, King’s view is akin to moderate fideism in the style of William James, who famously objects to the religion-denying evidentialist: ‘that a rule of thinking which would absolutely prevent me from acknowledging certain kinds of truth if those kinds of truth were really there, would be an irrational rule’. (‘The Will to Believe’, in The Will to Believe, Human Immortality, and Other Essays on Popular Philosophy, Dover Books, 1956, p. 28). From God’s perspective, then, what is required for special revelation is that finite minds receive the grace not to insist, with the moral evidentialist, that commitment must follow evidential certainty from an initially neutral position. This revelatory strategy also seems consonant with God’s salvific purposes in breaking down the egocentric self-reliance which may motivate aversion to the vulnerability of supra-evidential commitment.

Sometimes, however, King envisages that initial commitment may need to be supported by evidence that counts as sufficient from a neutral perspective. In particular, he suggests that miracles may be necessary for ‘setting up an initial revelatory context’ (184). One might wonder whether miracle mongering (in the sense of violating laws of nature) is consistent with the ‘discreet’ revelatory strategy that King has argued is God’s best option. But if it is, and miracles are furthermore needed for the initial reception of revelation, then, if Hume is right that it will always be unreasonable to accept testimony to a miracle, God will be blocked altogether from special revelation. King accordingly argues that Hume cannot be right, and suggests that he is here taking a ‘distinctive’ approach to Hume (187). Given, however, that King does not engage directly in the critique of Hume’s (or Mackie’s, similar, latter-day) argument, one might just as well appeal to Hume in order to reinforce the more fideist interpretation of King’s trust-evidentialism proposed above.

There seem to be tensions, then, in the answer King gives to one of his key questions, namely, how God’s self-testimony may best be conveyed ‘so as to give sufficient evidence for trust’ (173). That ‘sufficient evidence’, he allows, may be ‘private’ even though ‘there will always be a wider evidential logic that is relied on’ (176). But in his discussion of the epistemology of testimony, King argues that, since the situation involves ‘considerable personal commitment or risk’, accepting that an experience is genuinely revelatory will require independent evidence of the trustworthiness of what is putatively God’s self-testimony. Nevertheless this ‘reductionist’ requirement (where the testimony is not properly accepted, absent defeaters, just on the say-so of the testifier) seems unable to be met: ‘Under the reductionist account, God cannot give knowledge through any specific revelation of himself because he can never give evidence independent of his self-testimony’ (196-7). If this is so, how could any evidence, including private evidence, be genuinely sufficient for trust?

The way out of this problem, King thinks, is to stress that we can gain knowledge of the necessary structure of revelation — of how God would, if he exists, be constrained in disclosing himself — quite independently of anything allegedly revealed by God: ‘a coherent divine plan for giving revelation is coherent independently of whether or not God tells us that this is so’ (197, his emphasis). Given this knowledge, we may then go out and look for the predicted kind of evidence. And then — King is suggesting — when we find it (the private evidence of an ‘inner call’, or reports of incarnation and resurrection, for example [see p. 204]), we come to possess evidential grounds for initial commitment. But this does not eliminate the need for a venture beyond anything that could count as objectively sufficient evidence from a neutral point of view, if, as seems likely, any experience which may be interpreted as revelatory may also equally coherently be interpreted otherwise. This point King clearly grants, as the following summary of ‘the core of [his] journey-epistemology’ shows:

One tries to find the best evidence available, or the reasons of the head, but then it comes down to a decision whether to trust (commit) or not, since the nature of journey-epistemology is that one has to trust X when X testifies that y is the case about the journey and the end-point of the journey. A measure of evidence for y may be available, but necessarily it is not sufficient evidence in itself to enable one to know that y is the case (otherwise one would not need X, or someone else, to testify). So then one comes to reasons of the heart: desires, personal goals, fears, suspicions, will, conscience, selfishness, resistance to potential costs or difficulties, moral or ethical appeal of the vision, aesthetic appeal and so forth. (213-4, my emphasis)

On a Christian account, these ‘reasons of the heart’ include promptings such as ‘feelings of life stirred up by encounters with [Christ] or accounts of him, … awakenings of conscience and an ethical vision inspired by the vision set forth by Christ in his recorded teachings’ (214). These may be the motivational grounds for commitment, but, rather than counting them as evidence (albeit, subjective), one might prefer James’s understanding of them as ‘passional’ (non-evidential) causes of a belief to whose truth one may reasonably venture to commit beyond (though not against) the support of objective evidence — provided the issue is of sufficient existential significance to require practical decision. I suggest, then, that anyone who thinks that evidence that would justify initial commitment to God’s existence and trustworthiness will count as such only if it conforms to the norms of an ‘externally’ applicable evidential practice may regard King’s trust-evidentialism and journey epistemology as an essentially fideist position, albeit one with reasonable claims to be both plausible and attractive.