Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., Legal Theory, and Judicial Restraint

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Frederic R. Kellogg, Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., Legal Theory, and Judicial Restraint, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 218pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521866502.

Reviewed by Brian Z. Tamanaha, St. John's University School of Law


Anyone who writes a book about Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., takes on a difficult burden.  Holmes left behind an extraordinary volume of written work, including judicial decisions, articles, letters, and books which total thousands of pages.  Familiarizing oneself with his work, at least beyond a superficial level, requires a monumental effort.  But the real difficulty in writing about Holmes is having something new to say. There is an enormous number of books and articles about Holmes the man, his judicial decisions, and his views of law.  This cumulative body of material is so expansive that in 1978 a separate bibliography was published on What Justice Holmes Wrote and What Has Been Written About Him: 1866-1976; and the flow of published works on Holmes appears to have increased in the three decades that followed.  As Kellogg observes, since 1984 there "have been four biographies, four symposia, two new collections of his writing, two volumes of essays and one evaluating his contemporary influence, and numerous articles and monographs" (xi)So what does his own book add?

Kellogg argues that Holmes set out a distinctive theory of the common law which merits recovery because it offers a viable approach to constitutional, statutory, and common law decision-making that produces a desirable amount of judicial restraint.  He claims Holmes's theory holds the promise to address "the interpretation of a written constitution as it applies to the most vexing legal controversies of modern society." (16)  Kellogg is concerned with much more than providing a theory of interpretation, however, for a core theme that runs through the book is his criticism of legal positivism as an inadequate theory of law.  Kellogg offers "an alternative reading [of Holmes's work] that is … internally consistent and manifestly relevant to the history of legal philosophy and to the issues before us today" (93).

These are strong claims by the author, which the text fails to live up to.  The book's main strength is in drawing out and articulating Holmes's views of the common law and of constitutional interpretation.  Kellogg shows an impressive command of Holmes's opinions and writings, and he constructs a coherent account of Holmes's views of judicial decision making.  This account draws out the strong parallels between ideas in pragmatic philosophy -- which Holmes imbibed as a member of the Cambridge Metaphysical Club -- and Holmes's account of common law interpretation.  For anyone interested in this subject, the book is well worth reading.  What the book does not do, however, is convincingly show how Holmes's theory would help resolve our most vexing legal controversies in the constitutional context.  Although Kellogg details the approach, he does not apply it to any current controversy.  Thus he fails to demonstrate how it would work in practice, and he fails to play out its full implications (and limitations) in the contemporary situation.

The book is even more problematic in its attempt to engage legal philosophy.  Kellogg recognizes that Holmes has often been identified as a legal positivist in connection with his views about the separation of law and morality.  Kellogg counters this characterization of Holmes.  A recurrent theme throughout the book is that Holmes, as a historical matter, was critical of John Austin's views of law in at least two key respects.  Austin, by Kellogg's account, engaged in purely abstract conceptual analysis and he maintained a strict "ontological separation" between law and morality (41)Kellogg insists that Holmes's view that the law develops through a multitude of decisions by juries and judges in the context of specific and recurring disputes is contrary to the abstract bent of legal positivism (111).  Moreover, Holmes's position that the moral views of a community make their way into the law via this mode of decision making is inconsistent with the separation thesis.  Hence, according to Kellogg, Holmes did not, "as with Hobbes and Austin, draw an inviolable barrier separating contemporary ethical standards of conduct from law" (88).

Legal positivism, which serves as the villain in this book, obviously provokes Kellogg's ire.  Although a number of theorists -- including critics like Ronald Dworkin and John Finnis, as well as others like Jeremy Waldron and William Twining -- have asserted that contemporary legal positivism is becoming an obscure preserve of a narrow band of legal philosophers,[1] Kellogg thinks otherwise. 

I suggest that positivism does exercise continuing influence beyond academia, and on contemporary modes of legal thinking.  Its long shadow is cast over the problem of constitutional interpretation, where text is viewed as supreme and exhaustive. (116)

Kellogg appears to "blame" legal positivism for Scalia's textual approach to constitutional interpretation: "The roots of textualism are, if not grounded in analytical positivism, certainly closer to it than to common law" (153)Kellogg offers no evidence or argument to support these striking claims.

Two points stand out about Kellogg's discussion of legal positivism.  First, although he discusses Austin and Hart, he does not explicitly engage the work of a single current legal positivist.  Second, it is not clear that any legal positivist espouses the separation thesis in the sense that offends Kellogg.  Austin and Hart both acknowledged that the moral views of the community underpin many legal rules, and it is not obvious that they would disagree with Holmes's account of how this comes about.  Furthermore, contemporary "inclusive legal positivists" -- which Kellogg belatedly and briefly mentions two-thirds into the text -- find it perfectly acceptable for a legal system to incorporate moral standards, which belies his repeated assertions that legal positivism maintains a strict separation.  These flaws might be excusable in a purely historical account, but Kellogg presents his book as a contribution to legal philosophy today.

Most of these critical objections fall away if one takes Kellogg's book in a more modest (yet still worthy) posture of setting out a coherent account of Holmes's theory of common law interpretation and showing its parallels to the pragmatic view of knowledge development.  Again, that is the strength of the book.  Kellogg summarized Holmes's view:

Holmes called this process "successive approximation."  Legal rules are viewed historically, and Holmes here proposes that they be understood as emerging from classes of activity, or more precisely from classes of disputes within discrete activities.  As new cases arise within a given class, for example, vehicular accidents or communications among people forming contractual arrangements, they are initially decided on their facts, a case at a time.  Eventually, a body of decided cases can be "reconciled," with the laying down of a general rule, after time has permitted sufficient case-specific analysis, probing the relevant varieties and conditions of accidents or contractual communications. (28)

Through this gradual process of the accretion of a multitude of decisions, by juries and judges (Holmes's emphasis over time shifted from the former to the latter), rules begin to emerge, rules which reflect community values and practices.  This description matches the pragmatist account of knowledge as the product of a community of inquirers pursuing projects in the world, refining what they know and do in accordance with successes and failures.

Logic and abstract concepts are not what drive this process, but rather dealing with common problems thrown up by society, which is in a constant state of change.  As Kellogg put it:

Insofar as law is the result of centuries of collective responses to social disputes and conflicts, imperfectly refined and rationalized by judges, legislators, and scholars, it is the residue of the actual historical reasoning process of society, warts and all: vestiges, fictions, intellectualisms, and unresolved struggles in a retrospectively camouflaged display.  Despite emergent and changing patterns of conduct, struggles among competing interests, and flawed individual judgments, the depiction leaves ample room for a gradual and revisable formation of consensus. (108)

Because this emergent process of law creation is piecemeal and backward looking, law remains behind the times, waiting for a consensus to emerge and recognizing it as such only after the fact.  This characteristic is what Kellogg identifies as the element of "judicial restraint" that he sees in Holmes's theory of interpretation.  When rendering decisions about what the law is, judges should not get out ahead of the consensus.  And judges must be especially cautious in situations in which the community is sharply divided.  

A pressing question raised by Kellogg's account is how or whether this set of views about the common law translates into the constitutional context.  In response, Kellogg notes that up through the nineteenth century, no sharp differentiations were made between common law, statutory, and constitutional interpretation.  They were all considered integrated aspects of law.  Holmes thus carried over the same interpretive sensibility from common law cases to constitutional decision making.  What this means concretely is that judges should refrain from declaring decisions based upon constitutional principles until a consensus is clear, for that closes off or squelches experimentation and hinders the development of legal rules through many small steps.

Kellogg's account of Holmes's view of interpretation revolves around this basic set of themes.  He recognizes that Holmes did not always render decisions as a judge in a manner consistent with this theory of interpretation, but he insists that, nonetheless, much of what Holmes did as a judge and wrote as a theorist can be understood in these terms.  Holmes aficionados will no doubt take issue with this and other claims by Kellogg about Holmes's views -- so vast and complex is Holmes's legacy that it can be read on different sides of many issues -- but the account Kellogg constructs is consistent and informative, and it matches general understandings of the common law that circulated in the late nineteenth century when Holmes developed his views of law.

As indicated earlier, it is difficult to assess what this view of interpretation offers to contemporary debates over constitutional interpretation -- which is Kellogg's stated ambition -- because he does not actually apply it to any current controversy.  Nor does he compare Holmes's approach to the full range of extant theories of constitutional interpretation -- at most making a few negative comments about Scalia's textual approach -- although he notes the affinity of Holmes's account to Cass Sunstein's minimalism.

Despite the flaws identified above (mainly owing to an unnecessary overselling of what it has to offer), Oliver Wendell Holmes, Jr., Legal Theory, and Judicial Restraint, is well written, knowledgeable, and puts forth an informative argument about Holmes's views of legal interpretation.   


[1] See Brian Z. Tamanaha, "The Contemporary Relevance of Legal Positivism," Australian Journal of Legal Philosophy, v. 32 (forthcoming 2007), available at http://papers.ssrn.com/sol3/papers.cfm?abstract_id=960280.